Kantian Nonconceptualism

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Dennis Schulting (ed.), Kantian Nonconceptualism, Palgrave Macmillan, 2016, 332pp., $109.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137535160.

Reviewed by James R. O'Shea, University College Dublin


This is an outstanding collection of eleven newly commissioned articles by leading figures in the recent debates on nonconceptualist and conceptualist interpretations of Kant's theory of cognition, with applications also to his accounts of agency and aesthetics. The contributors will be well known to anyone who has been following those recent debates: Lucy Allais, Sacha Golob, Anil Gomes, Stefanie Grüne, Robert Hanna, Dietmar H. Heidemann, Thomas Land, Colin McLear, Christian Onof, Dennis Schulting, Andrew Stephenson, and Clinton Tolley. The primary focus of the majority of the contributions, appropriately enough, is on the classic question as to how to interpret correctly the role of sensible intuition and its relationship to conceptual thinking in Kant's account of perceptual cognition in the Critique of Pure Reason. In recent decades this topic has been reinvigorated by related disputes about nonconceptual content in the philosophy of perception. The problem is one that cuts to the core of Kant's critical philosophy, and various proposed solutions to it over the years have proven difficult to reconcile with all of the relevant texts. This volume will update any interested reader on both the best current Kant scholarship on the matter and the philosophical problem itself insofar as it relates to the nature and coherence of Kant's transcendental philosophy.

It is difficult to state the problem in a way that is neutral across the various interpretations. In fact, a useful feature of this volume is that each contributor displays detailed knowledge of, and is sensitive to, the various challenges raised by all of the others. This particular interpretive dispute has reached an impressive level of dialectical sophistication, to the benefit of our understanding of key elements and terms in Kant's theoretical philosophy. To state the source of the dispute in an oversimplified way: various central texts from Kant seem strongly to support, on the one hand, the conceptualist view that we cannot have any sensible intuitions of particular objects or appearances in space and time without such experiences being informed by our conceptual capacities; while on the other hand, other texts seem strongly to support the opposed nonconceptualist view that sensible intuition in its own right does (or at least, could) give us (or at least, other animals) cognition of (or at least, sensory "acquaintance" with) objects or appearances (or at least, "particulars"), independently of conceptualization. The various parenthetical qualifications here reflect various different ways in which some of the contributors seek to harmonize Kant's seemingly discordant claims in favour of "moderate" or reconciling versions of nonconceptualism.

As Allais in particular has emphasized over the last decade in support of her original nonconceptualist reading, which is further developed in chapter one, both the prior positioning and the arguments of Kant's transcendental aesthetic (hereafter 'TAe') in the first Critique suggest a carefully delimited but concept-independent role for nonconceptual sensible intuition -- or as Allais frames her interpretation, for a direct sensory-intuitive "acquaintance with particulars" -- in Kant's account of both our and other animal's perceptual capacities. Following upon Schulting's introduction to the main contours of the dispute along with brief summaries of the chapters, Allais provides a judicious overview of key distinctions that have emerged from the recent discussions, helpfully drawing upon many of the arguments that have been put forward by the other contributors, but paying particular attention to how these debates have led her to clarify her own moderate nonconceptualist view in specific ways. Thus she concedes (p. 5) that conceptualists have offered strong reasons to attribute to Kant "the view that we are in fact presented with intuitions that are conceptualised," while her argument is "merely that [Kant] does not hold that intuitions are dependent on being conceptualised for their possibility," i.e. "to be intuitions" that give us objects directly, in the form of particulars immediately present to consciousness by means of perceptual acquaintance, independently of the conceptualization of them that is necessary for our cognitive recognition or experience of them as unified persisting objects.

The challenge for Allais, as for the many other moderate nonconceptualist contributors, then becomes one of clarifying just what is the distinctive concept-independent contribution that is made by our intuitive acquaintance with "perceptual particulars," to use Allais' term, while granting that Kant's transcendental deduction (TD) in particular shows that as far as our mature human "cognition" and "experience" of objects as such is concerned (p. 4), intuition does not in fact swing free of, but is rather radically "transformed by conceptualization" (Allais, pp. 9, 25). More on this issue below.

Hanna is similarly well-known for his nonconceptualist interpretation of Kant over roughly the same period. Here he argues that already during Kant's later pre-Critical period (or as he suggests, Kant's "proto-Critical period" (p. 212)) from the 1768 Directions in Space to the 1772 Inaugural Dissertation, Kant's well-known appeals to incongruent counterparts (e.g., same-sized but non-superimposable left and right hands) already suggest that space for Kant is, as Hanna puts it, "an egocentrically centred, orientable space with inherent structural asymmetries" and intrinsic directions that are "fixed indexically and locally by conscious embodied perceivers" located within the same "global space-frame" (p. 105). By itself, as Allais points out, the case of incongruent counterparts by itself does not show that conceptualization is not also necessary (though not sufficient) for such experiences. But Hanna does briefly appeal to various ostensibly nonconceptualist-supporting texts (discussed throughout the volume) to support his conclusion that for Kant "the form of our outer sensibility or intuition is essentially nonconceptual and also a priori" (p. 108), thus constituting what he calls Kant's "transcendental idealism for sensibility" (p. 112).

By contrast to the above considerations, however, Kant's TD, particularly in the B-edition, has suggested to conceptualist interpreters (most famously, label aside, by John McDowell (1994), and most recently by James Conant (2017)) that Kant's TAe has to be understood as a delicate exercise in abstraction, whereby Kant explicitly methodologically prescinds from his own upcoming arguments in the transcendental analytic such as TD. In the latter Kant seeks to make clear (and seeks to make even more clear in the re-written TD) the equally indispensable role of pure concepts or categories in any experiential cognition of objects as appearances that is possible for us. (I return to the "for us" below.) Here we find that "intuitions without concepts are blind" (A51/B75), and that "the manifold in a given intuition . . . necessarily stands under categories" (B143), an "object" of our cognition being precisely "that in the concept of which the manifold of a given intuition is united" (B137; also A109, A112). Such passages seem to suggest that concepts are necessary for the possibility of any sensible intuition of objects as appearances. In light of this, Hanna draws the conclusion -- at too steep an interpretive cost in the eyes of the other contributors -- that Kant's TD is in fact unsound, since contrary to TD some ("rogue") objects are indeed given to us independently of any categorial synthesis of understanding.

Allais, as we saw, seeks to avoid that conclusion by distinguishing TD's evident conceptualism about our cognitive experience of objects as such, from what she argues is the mistaken attempt to read Kant as insisting that conceptual synthesis is necessary for sensible intuition to give us an object (as say intuition does), affording a direct acquaintance with or immediate presence of the object. But Kant's TD encourages us to ask: the object is present to our conscious acquaintance as what, if not as an object? Beyond the appeal to Kant's various brief remarks in his other works on what non-human animal representation or association or sensory acquaintance might be like -- certainly a pertinent and important but inevitably underdetermined topic in Kant to which several contributors make reference, but which space prevents exploration of here -- Allais introduces her conception of spatiotemporally (as opposed to conceptually) unified manifolds of "particulars," as how objects present themselves to us and other animals directly in our sub-cognitive but nonetheless conscious acquaintance with their presence to us. The reader would really have to explore Allais' 2015 book Manifest Reality to evaluate properly this important proposed solution to the problem, an excursion well worth it whether one ends up agreeing or not.

Several of the other nonconceptualist contributors are clearly in the philosophical neighborhood of Allais' evolving position, but differ from her view in various key respects. Golob's "Why the Transcendental Deduction is Compatible with Nonconceptualsim" similarly seeks to preserve TD's conceptualist outlook in the case of our cognition as a "more sophisticated achievement" than is the case with other animals' (nonconceptual) cognition. For us, Golob explains, cognition involves our (potentially self-conscious) representation of "a certain privileged class of spatial or temporal relations" as such -- for example, certain mereological whole-part relations and relations implicated in the subjective/objective distinction (pp. 41-2). Golob, in part citing contributor Gomes' previous work for support, argues that Allais' conception of TD as (allegedly) pertaining merely to "our applying" the categories in our thinking and judging about already given empirical objects, is too weak to show (for example, against Hume) that the categories must apply to the objects, not just that we must apply them in our thinking (pp. 36-8, 43-7). Allais in her chapter one in fact attempts to address Gomes' original version of this objection (pp. 22-4), which is one among many instances of helpful argumentative exchange across the contributors in the volume.

Golob himself argues for the moderate nonconceptualist thesis, as Allais had done in a different way, "that the categories are not necessary for empirical intuition" itself, but (in his version) "only for representing certain complex relations among such intuitions" (p. 44). This arguably lands us again with the task of somehow substantively indicating, beyond the appeals to other animals (which are, for various general as well as Kant-specific reasons, open to very different interpretations in this debate), just what these concept-independent manifold intuitions are and what roles they are supposed to play in cognition. Golob makes significant efforts along these lines, as does Onof in his contribution, "Is There Room for Nonconceptual Content in Kant's Critical Philosophy?" Onof, too, brings out the comprehensive conceptualist implications of Kant's TD, as far as any cognition of objects "as objects," which can be anything to us, is concerned (p. 219); and he agrees with Allais and Golob that this strand in Kant's thinking nonetheless leaves a moderate nonconceptualist thesis intact. In Onof's account, however, the sorts of "particulars" or "features" that such "perceptual cognition of things (PCT)" or "particulars" gives us must, for us, be a "subpersonal" and "subjective" role (in contrast to Allais' view). This goes beyond the repeated nonconceptualist appeals to Kant's remarks on non-human animals, to an appeal to "features of my subjective experience" (p. 220).

Onof helpfully attempts to clarify this "subjective" aspect further through a substantive analysis of how, arguably, the first two of the three syntheses in TD's (A-edition) "threefold synthesis" of sensory apprehension, associative reproduction (imagination), and conceptual recognition, can for these purposes be teased apart from the third conceptual synthesis, as would (arguably) also be the case with nonhuman animal-associative cognition. The effort proves to be one well worth exploring, though it is likely that conceptualist-leaning Kantians will find problematic Onof's resulting conception of how, in our case, these subjective, subpersonal, and associative perceptual cognitions of things in the end involve "the understanding steering these processes through the synthesis of recognition" (pp. 221-2).

Along broadly similar moderate-nonconceptualist lines, Schulting's chapter ten critique of Robert Pippin's influential conceptualist-leaning, Hegelian reading of Kant also stresses a central distinction that functions within his account in ways similar to those discussed above in Allais, Golob, and Onof. In Schulting's case the distinction is between "the epistemic and constitutive levels" of Kant's account (p. 254), the former pertaining to our (mature, human) cognition of objects as such -- in particular, as conceptualized in the ways demanded by TD, such that any intuited "sense content is intelligible only on condition that it is grasped or determined by an act of understanding." This Schulting opposes to the "absolute externality" of what constitutes sensible intuition or "sense content" itself, as an independent "constraint" on conceptualization (p. 253). Here again questions might be pressed as to just what the absolutely concept-independent constitution of "sense content" is. In the dialectically fraught (though pertinent) references to Kant's scattered remarks on non-human animals, some conceptualist Kantians will no doubt diagnose the implicit assumption of an optional "common factor + something added" conception of the nature of the differences between human and non-human animal cognition (e.g., p. 243). Conversely, Schulting's description of "the perspective of the understanding, of the cognising subject" as a "sideways-on perspective" (p. 252) was for me a perplexing moment in his account, given any understanding of the McDowellian use of the latter phrase with which I am familiar.

That said, I am sympathetic with the above attempts to reconcile in some such way both the ostensibly conceptualist and nonconceptualist strands of argument in Kant's overall view, in the above cases by attempting to embrace both of those aspects consistently when certain distinctions are either highlighted in, or brought to bear on, Kant's view. In relatively recent analytic Kantian philosophy this is a general strategy that traces back to Gareth Evans in the 1970s and Wilfrid Sellars in the 1960s, each of them systematically developing (in terms of this later debate) a combined conceptualist and nonconceptualist approach to perceptual content from a broadly Kantian perspective. (In the recent literature Sellars is usually briefly glimpsed through the lens of McDowell's influential Mind and World, and partly as a result Sellars has almost universally but mistakenly been portrayed as having been himself a "strong conceptualist" (in Hanna's sense). In fact, however, Sellars' corpus is correctly read as a pre-Evans origin of the reconciling approaches to "sensible intuitions," both in the interpretation of Kant and concerning nonconceptual sensory-representational "mapping" content in general, with Sellars' own reconciling view having attempted to articulate and push both content-strands simultaneously as far as they can be pushed.) Whatever the merits of such combined approaches to perceptual cognition in general, it remains exceedingly difficult to tell a consistent and yet substantive Tale of Two Contents about how the two species of representational content -- if indeed there are such -- were intended to come together in Kant's account. The detailed interpretive arguments contained in this fine volume, however, make it one of the best resources currently available for anyone wanting to pursue that particular task.

In addition to the above sources of support for the various moderate or reconciling nonconceptualist views, the volume also reflects important additional sources of support for nonconceptualist or "Sensibilist" (as opposed to conceptualist or "Intellectualist") readings in general in recent years. McLear's contribution, "Getting Acquainted with Kant," argues that Kant's "modal condition" on cognition, requiring a demonstration of the real possibility of the objects concerned, on balance supports Sensibilist over Intellectualist readings. Tolley's "The Difference Between Original, Metaphysical and Geometrical Representations of Space" is an important piece of work, though I confess that I found implausible Tolley's pivotal reading of "absolute unity" in the argument of TD at A99, which he reads as implying a unified spatial manifold prior to conceptual synthesis (pp. 278-82), given that Kant's focus in the immediate context is on a temporal succession of moments as absolute unities. Also insightful, and instructive on possible deeper reasons for the structure of the overall debate, is the neutral presentation in Gomes and Stephenson's "On the Relation of Intuition to Cognition." This examines the implications (on both sides) of the recent competing conceptions of intuitions of objects as either object-dependent or alternatively object-independent forms of representation (Hanna, Allais, and Gomes defending object-dependent views of intuition, for instance, while Sellars, Aquila, Grüne, and Stephenson, for instance, are cited as defending the object-independent view: pp. 56-8). Along very different lines, Heidemann's discussion of the role of nonconceptual feeling in Kant's account of aesthetic judgment in the third Critique adds yet another nonconceptualist resource to the mix.

All of the above perhaps leaves a disproportionate burden on the two moderate conceptualist contributions to the volume -- Grüne's "Sensible Synthesis and the Intuition of Space" and Land's "Moderate Conceptualism and Spatial Representation" -- to reflect the more conceptualist-leaning positions in the wider literature, though this is, after all, a book on Kantian Nonconceptualism. However, many of the usual conceptualist arguments and texts are sympathetically presented in the volume by the moderate or reconciling nonconceptualists such as Allais, Golob, Gomes and Stephenson, Onof, Schulting, and Tolley. But the contributions by Grüne and Land appropriately go further in offering moderate conceptualist responses to some of the more compelling considerations advanced by nonconceptualists, concerning Kant's views on spatial representation in particular.

Grüne attempts to rebut fellow contributor McClear's recent (2015) nonconceptualist argument against "Intellectualism" understood as the view that all objective representation depends in part on a synthesis of parts into a whole (involving concepts, for example), and in favor of "Sensibilism," which takes Kant's TAe to show that our intuitions of space (and of time) do not presuppose a synthesis. In her tightly argued reply, Grüne plausibly distinguishes in Kant between our pure intuition of the single infinite space, as opposed to our intuitions (pure or empirical) of finite spaces. She then argues (against "Sensibilism") that the latter finite intuitions do indeed presuppose syntheses of "phenomenally present" objects, while granting that the intuition of infinite space strictly speaking does not (thus "modifying" the "Intellectualism" to apply only to the finite domain). However, when Grüne then further examines Kant's views (e.g., in On a Discovery and in Kästner's Treatises) of the "innate ground" of our "original acquisition" of the pure a priori intuition of space, this pure intuition, too, turns out to be inseparably connected with our encounters with finite phenomenal objects. So in the end there is no real retreat by Grüne from maintaining the "Intellectualist" priority of synthesis in the generation of our sensible intuitions.

When Grüne's argument is combined with Land's moderate conceptualist argument concerning the role of the productive imagination and the understanding in the generation of distinctively spatial forms of representation in our cognition, the resources of the conceptualist-leaning interpretations in the wider literature, too, show themselves to be on sufficiently impressive display within this outstanding collection of essays on the timely topic of Kantian Nonconceptualism .


Allais, Lucy (2015) Manifest Reality: Kant's Idealism and His Realism. Oxford University Press.

Conant, James B. (2017) "Kant's Critique of the Layer-Cake Conception of Human Mindedness in the B-Deduction," in James R. O'Shea, ed., Kant's Critique of Pure Reason: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, pp. 120-39.

McDowell, John (1996) Mind and World, 2nd ed., Harvard University Press.

McLear, Colin (2015) "Two Kinds of Unity in the Critique of Pure Reason." Journal of the History of Philosophy 53(1): 79-110.