Kantian Subjects: Critical Philosophy and Late Modernity

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Karl Ameriks, Kantian Subjects: Critical Philosophy and Late Modernity, Oxford University Press, 2019, 272pp., $58.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198841852.

Reviewed by Robert Pippin, University of Chicago


This volume is Karl Ameriks's latest collection of essays, the fifth in a series of valuable, focused collections: Kant and the Fate of Autonomy: Problems in the Appropriation of Critical Philosophy (2000); Interpreting Kant's Critiques (2003), Kant and the Historical Turn: Philosophy as Critical Interpretation (2006), and Kant's Elliptical Path (2012). The current collection of fifteen essays is split into two parts, called simply "Kant" as Part I and "Successors" in Part II. Part I mostly but not exclusively deals with issues in Kant's practical philosophy, especially the issues of self-determination and autonomy. Part II ranges more widely, with discussions of Hegel interpreters, Schelling, Hölderlin and other romantics, and Ameriks's own views on the current "historical task" of philosophy.

All the collections follow his ground-breaking book on the paralogisms, Kant's Theory of Mind (1982), one of the most influential books in modern Kant scholarship and a major factor in the revival of interest in Kant's metaphysics. Ameriks had argued in that book that before we categorize Kant as the destroyer of all metaphysics, we should realize that his objections are to several specific arguments for metaphysical conclusions. Those arguments are flawed, on his account, but their destruction is not the destruction of metaphysics. There is plenty of room left open for other approaches, other arguments. The tenor of that approach -- don't saddle Kant with sweeping conclusions he never defended and then criticize him for them -- is present in a great deal of Ameriks's work and is particularly prominent in this newest collection, where the focus is on Kant's account of the human subject and its capacities in knowing and acting, how that account has been interpreted and often misinterpreted, and what the legacy of Kant's doctrine was for later German philosophers, what limitations in the doctrine might have led to expanded or non-Kantian positions.

This plea for a great deal more care and interpretive caution than is prominent in criticisms of, in particular, Kant and the early Romantics, is one of the major threads running through the collection. Avoiding straw man characterizations, stereotypes, "baby out with the bathwater" criticisms and the like are issues in almost every chapter. For Ameriks, we live in a post-Kantian world (which he also characterizes as "late modernity," about which more below), where that means acknowledging the powerful (but limited) authority of modern science, a practical philosophy oriented from autonomy, and the thought that philosophy has a distinctive cultural role to play, so getting the issue of "Kant" and what he bequeathed is quite important in his approach. For Ameriks, we can take on board much of the post-Kantian turn in philosophy -- the modern appreciation of the historical embeddedness of philosophy, an orientation from subjectivity and a radically new conception of aesthetics and aesthetic value -- all without historicism, subjectivism and aestheticism if only we appreciate the "modest" results available to philosophy, with Kant first blazing some of the right path. ("Modesty" is le mot juste for Ameriks's approach; it is also particularly prominent in his 2000 collection on the fate of autonomy.)

So he argues that in the well-known criticisms of Kant on self-determination and autonomy, interpreters either over-emphasize the "autos," or self-legislating dimension, making the position seem radically subjectivist and constructivist, or the "nomos" dimension, with an overly objectivist notion of moral law (requiring what Ameriks calls "panicky metaphysics") and rigoristic moral doctrines. So, without having the space here to rehearse how he comes to this conclusion, one can still appreciate the general tenor of the approach with respect to such contested issues as our "authorship" of the moral law: "speaking of reason's authorship can thus be understood as a technical move, limited to a very specific meaning concerning faculties, and having only partial, metaphorical overlaps with familiar notions of empirical authorship and legislation." (28) In a discussion of Eckart Förster's work on the history of Kant and post-Kantian philosophy, the Groundwork, and criticisms like Garve's, "as long as one has a relatively modest conception of what Critical philosophy really can do, and needs to do, the problems that Garve raises do not, by themselves, seem so crucial after all." (51-2)

In responding to Hegelian critics of Kant like Stephen Houlgate, it is wrong, Ameriks argues, to accuse Kant of a wild subjectivism in his idealism. That ignores how carefully idealism follows from premises which include a number of objective premises, especially particular metaphysical features of space and time, none of which premises would lead to the denial of an objective, external world in favor of mere representations. (This is quite reasonable and certainly correct about the external world issue, but it does not seem to me really to deflate the radicality of Kant's position. There are analytically necessary features of space as such, its infinity for example, but Kant's final position remains extreme, not modest: space and time are not just knowable via pure intuition; space and time themselves are said to be subjective forms of intuition.) Both an "ontology of representations" interpretation of Kant, and a purely epistemological or methodological one with no subjectivist metaphysical implications, are one-sided. Ameriks writes that "I find both these approaches to be too pessimistic about the possibility of a 'moderate' interpretation that combines an acceptance of straightforward metaphysical claims in Kant's philosophy with a denial of the presumption of other interpreters" who hold that Kant is committed to "demoting the reality of the external world." (142-3) Or, we can take what Ameriks has called "The Historical Turn" in philosophy as long as we keep our wits about us, which according to Ameriks many who took the turn did not do (cf. "overly presumptuous" 162), and stick with "a significantly more cautious attitude toward the standard presumption of demonstrable teleological content in history and philosophy." (155)

Hölderlin, especially in Hyperion, emerges as a Kantian (and Ameriks's) hero, because he sketches poetically as a psychological ideal not only a balanced relation among the faculties, but an overall position that avoids the (putative) extremes of other post-Kantians: Hegel's heavy emphasis on objective ethical life and his distrust of the ethical significance of inner and emotional life; Kierkegaard's absolute religiosity, one that excludes rather than incorporates ethical and aesthetic dimensions of experience; and Nietzsche's appreciation of the aesthetic dimension without his aestheticization of moral life. Indeed the early Romantics generally are Ameriks's heroes; they embody the "sensible late modern position" (218), in between Kantian rationalism (Kant for all of his glories is still one of the systematic and comprehensive "imperialist" philosophers of "early" modernity) and Nietzschean and eventually Heideggerian irrationalism. In a nice turn of phrase, the romantics are said to represent an "ever more reflexive understanding of humanity's tragic discontent with itself." (227) It is hard to imagine disagreeing with the value of such an "understanding," but one also wonders what sort of content, or substantive claims, are consistent with an approach so hedged, when it is described this way:

Precisely because they did not take the systematicity of modern science to be the best model for philosophy in general, they realized that the most consistent and effective advocacy of their progressivist universalist views required an innovative methodology, an imaginative form of writing that would effectively draw attention to, and stimulate, the subjective and aesthetic dimensions of experience even while remaining sensitive to the dangers of aestheticism and subjectivism in general. (224)

One wonders how "innovative" and "imaginative" such an approach could be, if so cautious about "subjectivism" and "aestheticism." Of course, the proof that this is indeed possible would be what various romantics wrote, and Ameriks is here sketching the goals of the project, not the individual details.

But this emphasis on modesty and caution is only one of the threads running through the collection. There are two others that are important: what Ameriks means by the task or vocation in philosophy in what he calls "late modernity," and a broader issue that is the presupposition of the modernity issue, what Ameriks calls, here and elsewhere, "The Historical Turn." (These threads hardly exhaust the value of the collection. There are a number of illuminating close readings of Kantian passages, reasonable and erudite responses to Kantian interpreters and critics, and valuable contextualizations of the historical state of play faced by various figures. The discussions of Hölderlin are especially rich.)

The claim that there is an epoch that can be characterized as "late modernity" shows up throughout but is especially important in Chapter Thirteen, "On Some Reactions to Kant's 'Tragic Problem'," and Chapter Fourteen, "The Historical Turn and Late Modernity." Late modernity is to be distinguished from modernity proper by first understanding the latter's ideal as what Ameriks calls "imperialist" philosophy, his designation of the "presumptuous" ambitions, (doomed to fail and so to provoke such a reaction) in modern or Enlightenment philosophy. (1) A primitive apodictic foundation and (2) a vast interconnected set of derivable and universally applicable exact results, all aimed at a 'heavenly city' of the future to be built without reliance on the non-naturalist metaphysics associated with special revelation." (216) More generally, the attempt was to make natural science the foundation of philosophy, all of which, in its attack on traditional philosophy, ironically retains the "imperialist" ambition Ameriks associates most closely with a philosopher he has done more than anyone to locate in this discussion, Reinhold. (217) It is something like the collapse of confidence in this program (especially a growing pessimism that scientific naturalism could address the problems of ethics, politics, art and human religiosity) that marks the beginning of "late modernity" and which introduces the early romantics and their "sensible," "in-between" position noted above as the proper response. The situation is also discussed as "Kant's tragic problem," a reference to Nietzsche's pithy formulation of the problem in his early 1872 essay on "The Philosopher: Reflections on the Struggle between Art and Knowledge."

Man's longing to be completely truthful in the midst of a mendacious
natural order is something noble and heroic. But this is possible only in a
very relative sense. That is tragic. That is Kant's tragic problem! Art now
acquires an entirely new dignity. The sciences, in contrast, are degraded to
a degree.[1]

The Romantics, Hölderlin again above all, are said to have the "sensible late modern position," and this because they show us how to respond appropriately to this development without subjectivism (which invariably leads to an enervating relativism), aestheticism or historicism. (218)

This very picture, understanding the Romantics as addressing an inherited historical situation that generates a problem they must work to resolve and then assessing the degree to which they did, as a general model for understanding philosophical positions, is what Ameriks means by "The Historical Turn." In point of fact, all five of Ameriks's collections can be said to embody this contextualizing and dialectical way of thinking about philosophical positions, and all of them, certainly including this one, are compelling testaments to the rewards of such an approach. As Ameriks points out, all of this assumes, and must defend, a certain directionality in history, at least in intellectual history, a major acknowledgement of the historical indebtedness of any position, as well as an attentiveness to shred common assumptions, even when there occur what Ameriks characterizes as "dramatic reversals." (236) He sums up his understanding of the Historical Turn this way:

a style of writing with an explicit stress on an argumentative but historically sensitive kind of sequential appropriation of the work of one's predecessors for the purpose of bringing about (in the context of an overall view of philosophy's history) a fundamentally new era . . . (236)

Ameriks's book, apart from the fine-grained detail of his defense of Kant against misinterpreting critics, is a statement of desiderata for philosophy in the late modern era, as well as an argument against any global skepticism about the prospects of such a historically self-conscious program. That argument, as we have seen, trades mostly on the virtues of modesty. In its own terms, the book is certainly a success and a must-read for anyone interested in such issues. However, apart from some remaining reservoirs of philosophical rationalism, modest or otherwise, in professional departments of philosophy, the extent of skepticism about even the modest desiderata sketched by Ameriks is so sweeping in modern cultural and intellectual life, that any faith in the possibility of achieving such desiderata is as extensive as skepticism about "imperialist" philosophy itself. This skepticism -- or more often, dogmatic "rejectionism" -- has to do with a variety of attacks on the independence or self-sufficiency of thought itself, and so about its putative role in directing a life in any sense. Such skepticism even takes in the possibility of something so modest as an "ever more reflexive understanding of humanity's tragic discontent with itself." Historical sensitivity and responsiveness to predecessors addresses some of those concerns, but not the most radical and most influential. The worry is that the collapse of the "imperialist" ambitions of pre- and Kantian positions may simply amount to a collapse of the philosophical enterprise itself, exactly the kind of "presumptuous" extreme reaction Ameriks warns against. This makes the stakes in actually achieving the desiderata sketched so admirably in this book all the greater.

[1] F. Nietzsche, Philosophy and Truth: Selections from Nietzsche's Notebooks of the early 1870's. Edited and translated by D. Breazeale (New Jersey: Humanities Press, 1979), p. 28. See also p. 11.