Kantianism, Liberalism, and Feminism: Resisting Oppression

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Carol Hay, Kantianism, Liberalism, and Feminism: Resisting Oppression, Palgrave Macmillan, 2013, 202pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137003898.

Reviewed by Helga Varden, University of Illinois at Urbana-Champaign


These are fun and inspiring times to be a Kantian philosopher! Carol Hay's new addition to Kantian scholarship proves the point. Hay's ability to identify and engage central philosophical issues at the core of any plausible account of oppression makes it a very interesting contribution to the growing scholarship on systemic justice in general as well as to the related Kantian and feminist scholarship in particular. I suspect we will be hearing much more from her in the years to come -- undoubtedly a good thing.

The book is divided into five chapters. In the first two, Hay lays out her Kantian, feminist theory. Chapters 3-5 apply the theory in a thorough philosophical analysis of several essential issues of sexual oppression. Below I sketch the content of each chapter as well as raise a few questions concerning elements of Hay's account. I consider questions concerning both Kant interpretation and Hay's proposal for the best Kantian account of oppression. I conclude by suggesting that most of my exegetical and philosophical worries may be overcome if Hay makes Kant's "Doctrine of Right" more central to her account of oppression.

Chapter 1 ("Liberalism & Oppression") develops a conception of oppression focused on a notion of "harm" that is both group-specific and "is part of a structural and systemic network of social institutions" (3). (Let me note that I was never able to figure out why Hay chose to use "harm" rather than the more natural Kantian alternative, "wrongdoing," as a key concept here.) Throughout the chapter, Hay develops her conception of oppression as a group-specific, systemic harm by relating it to central feminist and moral philosophers of most stripes, such as communitarian, Marxist, poststructuralist, virtue and care theorists. She convincingly argues that some of the more commonplace objections to liberal theory are misguided or unfair, whereas others raise issues that must be taken seriously. Influenced by Jean Hampton, Hay's alternative liberal theory, contrary to much liberal thought as well as Rawls's later philosophy, is committed to the claim that its basic tenets are "objectively true" (and so are at least "partially comprehensive") and consequently not merely "reasonable" within the context of the "liberal, constitutional democracy" (to use Rawlsian formulations). She aims to defend, in other, yet still Rawlsian words, Kantian feminism on "moral, rather than political, grounds." (39) As becomes clear this move to Kant's ethical theory -- including extensive analyses of Kant's concepts of virtuous action and self-respect -- is central to Hay's analysis of oppression, including why victims have a duty to fight it. Unfortunately, Hay doesn't address Thomas Pogge's quite influential suggestion that perhaps Kant's own legal-political theory (as found in the "Doctrine of Right") is "political, and not metaphysical." More generally, it remains a question for the reader why a Kantian feminist analysis of oppression (whether more or less "comprehensive") needs to rely as heavily as Hay does on Kant's ethics, rather than at least also on his political-legal theory as found in the "Doctrine of Right".

Chapter 2 sketches the Kantian moral account of the self that Hay uses in the remaining three chapters to develop her account of oppression. As sje notes, developing a plausible feminist Kantian theory of the self is impossible without dealing with the objection that Kant says some seemingly really nasty things about women. Second, such an account must deal with classic feminist objections to Kant regarding the importance of our embodiment and social natures. These objections include that a moral account must take seriously how we are born dependent beings (not full, rational selves), how a human being needs a certain social setting (such as a caring family) to develop well, and how many of our most important relationships are fundamentally asymmetrical in nature. Hay summarizes Kant's alleged failure to address these issues as the result of his privileging "the rational over the animal" (50). Third, the account must deal with the objection originally made most famous by Bernard Williams, and later developed by many feminists, that a full moral account must recognize the importance of our emotions, especially those moral emotions enabled by particular loving and caring others. For example, when we save someone we love, we should save them simply because we love them and not (also) because it is morally permissible. Hay paraphrases this objection by saying that Kant allegedly privileges "the rational over the emotional" (ibid.)

Hay addresses these three objections to Kant in the following way. First, she argues it is simply true that Kant was no feminist. Against Pauline Kleingeld, however, she maintains that because his anti-feminist statements are rare and not as offensive in his moral works, we can simply set many of them (especially those found in his "peripheral works. . . . [e.g., his] Anthropology" (50-51)) aside. Instead, we can use a gender-neutral language when developing the considered Kantian moral position. Second, Hay maintains that typical criticisms of Kant on issues of embodiment and our social natures are unfair. She states:

there is nothing [in Kant's account] preventing a Kantian feminist from inserting a more robust account of our moral lives -- one that addresses . . . [also] asymmetrical dependencies and the relationships in which they occur . . . . [or applies] his framework to a more comprehensive, inclusive, and diverse account of the human condition. (56)

Finally, regarding the third type of objection, Hay emphasizes that on the Kantian account, there is nothing wrong with acting from emotions, such as out of love. "Our actions," she continues, "are usually overdetermined anyway" (59) and acting out of a motivation other than duty is morally permissible so long as one accepts that "reason must take precedence over emotion when the two are in conflict." (59) In sum, Hay doesn't think that any of the shortfalls of Kant's own theory holds back the Kantian project. His sexism can be set aside, and the lack of attention to our "animal" and "emotional" natures can be rather easily remedied.

In contrast, what a feminist theory of oppression simply cannot do without, Hay maintains, are Kant's ideas of respect for others and for oneself. She proposes that the Kantian idea of self-respect gives "Kantianism . . . a way to explain what is wrong with . . . harms" like stereotype threat and adaptive preferences (73). Hay argues persuasively that harms such as these reveal how oppression can undermine women's self-respect, which is also why the Kantian duty of self-respect must be given a central role in a critique of women's duty to resist oppression. Her conclusion in chapter 2 is that Kant and feminists need each other: Kant's theory needs to get rid of its sexism as well as to incorporate more fully, at least, core feminist insights regarding our animal and emotional natures. Feminist theory needs to incorporate Kant's theory of respect, including self-respect, in its account of the duty to resist oppression.

Although I don't share Hay's view that Kant's non-moral works, such as the Anthropology, are peripheral to Kant's philosophy, I agree with her that Kant's moral theory doesn't treat women as badly as many think. I also think Hay could strengthen her criticism that feminists treat Kant unfairly when they insist that he focuses only on symmetrical relations between free and equal persons (or adult, rational selves). It's true that in the ethical writings this is typically the case. But in the "Doctrine of Right" Kant has a rather extensive discussion of asymmetrical relationships, such as those between parents and children and between families and their servants. I'm not quite convinced, however, that Hay's way of responding to Williams's (and related) feminist objections is sufficient. For example, it seems to me that Hay fails to engage a core challenge from this corner, namely that simply acting out of love is sometimes normatively required. Hay's view, by first establishing moral permissibility and second an act of love, still involves "one thought too many." These worries aside, the second chapter is rich and engaging, especially the way in which Hay organizes feminist objections to Kant and elicits many ways in which oppression threatens our self-respect.

Chapters 3-5 focus more explicitly on the issue of sexual oppression and especially on the duty to resist it. In each chapter, Hay utilizes an example, borrowed from the works of David Foster Wallace. At the Illinois State Fair, one of Wallace's female friends (named "Native Companion," hereafter NC) is sexually harassed. NC is riding the Zipper, and the men operating the ride stop it when NC is at the top hanging upside down, "so that her dress falls over her head and they can ogle her." (89) After the incident, Wallace and NC disagree about what should have been her reaction. Wallace thinks NC should have responded rather than ignored the sexual harassment. NC disagrees. Ultimately, Hay argues that it is unclear whether NC's judgment is correct -- in light of all the factors relevant to cases of sexual oppression -- or whether her failure to resist oppression is due to her simple denial that she has been a victim of sexual oppression (149). How Hay uses this example to shed light on many of the complexities in resistance to oppression is ingenious.

Chapter 3 is devoted to sexual harassment, which, Hay proposes, is a harm that "occurs against a cultural backdrop of gender-specific stereotypes and assumptions about sexual roles, desires, [and] behaviours." It "both derives from, and is a manifestation of . . . [men's] greater social power". Moreover, sexual harassment "stems from sexual objectification," and due to "the systematicity of oppression . . . either directly or indirectly . . . [sexual harassment] undermine[s] women's autonomy" (92). Because of the way in which sexual harassment participates in and reinforces the social norms of a sexist culture, "when a particular woman is sexually harassed, all women are, at least indirectly, harmed" (98). Instead of focusing attention on a woman's obligation to others to resist oppression and so protect everyone from harm, Hay concentrates on a woman's duty to herself, to protect herself against such harm. Contrary to several other feminist accounts, she also argues that insofar as an agent can be praised or blamed for her actions, she is responsible for how she reacts in a situation where she is being sexually harassed. Importantly, though, the degree to which she is held culpable for not fighting oppression depends "on whether she faces extenuating or exculpatory circumstances," such as the dangers involved in confronting sexual harassers (111). Hay concludes by suggesting that the persuasiveness of her account depends heavily on the extent to which there are ways of resisting sexual harassment, and so oppression, that do not involve "public protest." (115) What constitutes resistance, in turn, depends on one's notion of self-respect. Chapters 4 and 5 aim to clarify these connections by developing a distinctly Kantian conception of self-respect. Let's turn to that account now.

Because sexual oppression can undermine autonomy by damaging women's rational capacities, as we see in the consequences of stereotype threat and adaptive preferences, Hay, in chapter 4, argues that self-respect requires women to fight sexual oppression in all its forms. Responding to worries that this subjects women to an unreasonable moral demand she returns to Kant's notion of self-respect, as this is the proposed foundation of her feminist conception of the duty to fight oppression. In addition, to avoid the problem of being over-demanding and so to take seriously Kant's principle that "ought implies can" (we can only be obliged to do what is possible), Hay suggests that Kant's own view that self-respect is a perfect duty should be revised. We should instead think of self-respect as an imperfect duty (137). That is to say, imperfect duties are not as demanding as perfect duties, since there is some latitude with regard to when there is a duty to resist and how the obligation is met (135). Consequently, the corresponding duty to resist oppression is not too demanding since it is now understood as an imperfect duty. For example, not all resistance has to be through outward public action and the duty to resist might be discharged by merely inwardly acknowledging that one is being oppressed. Hay concludes that seeing self-respect as an imperfect rather than a perfect duty has two virtues: it is an improvement on Kant's own moral theory in that it provides for needed latitude, and it yields a conception of self-respect feminist theory needs in order to analyze oppression (140-54).

Analyzing self-respect as an imperfect duty is complemented by an analysis of respect-worthiness and dignity in the fifth and final chapter. Hay borrows Stephen Darwall's distinction between "recognition respect" and "appraisal respect" to suggest a new interpretation of Kant's notions of respect-worthiness and dignity. Such a distinction, she maintains, is necessary to explain how we can (and ought to) respect people who act in oppressive ways, including those who choose not to resist oppression when they should. She then seeks to find that distinction in Kant. Contrary to most interpretations, Hay decouples respect-worthiness and dignity by arguing that respect for all persons (regardless of what they have done) is captured by respect-worthiness (respect recognition). Respect-worthiness is seen as grounded in our humanity and rational nature. In contrast, dignity captures the extent to which we successfully act morally (virtuously), and so tracks Kant's ideas of personality and autonomy (appraisal respect) (160-166). Although Hay finds some support in the text, she admits that the interpretation is highly controversial, and indeed meets resistance elsewhere in Kant's text (172-177). Indeed, even the supporting passages she cites, I would argue, can be seen to conflict with her interpretation (for example p. 167, including notes). In any case, setting these textual quibbles aside, the philosophical question Hay (following Darwall) aims to answer is certainly important to any account of the duty of respect: how does a Kantian account explain the way in which we must respect those who act without any respect for others or for themselves as rational beings?

I have great sympathy for many of Hay's dialectical moves, especially those revealing her commitment to avoid overly simple (textual and philosophical) answers to the complex issues of sexual harassment and oppression. In fact, my main worry is that her account is not complex enough, which I see as due to three assumptions: i) that the duties to resist particular instances of sexual harassment and the social institutions of sexual oppression these instances participate in, can or should be analyzed in the same way; ii) that an ethical account of the allegedly imperfect duty of self-respect can provide the main "comprehensive" element a Kantian theory of justice needs to analyze oppression; and iii) that Kant's account of perfect duties (along with the principle that "ought implies can") is such that we can never find ourselves in situations from which there is no morally good way out. I suggest that by jettisoning all three assumptions, we have a better chance of getting what Hay wants in terms of theory. Moreover, that theory comes without the price of having to abandon core features of Kant's moral theory, such as self-respect as a perfect duty. In what follows, I'll sketch a picture of how these assumptions may be given up and the possible (philosophical and textual) advantages of doing so.

First, let's consider the distinction between sexual harassment and sexual oppression. To me, sexual harassment, on a Kantian account, is a kind of wrongdoing (not harm, as Hay argues) that presupposes (as Hay maintains) sexually oppressive social conditions. Moreover, in my view, the analysis of the sexually harassing action needs to be clearly distinguished from the analysis of sexual oppression, and both accounts (of harassment/oppression) require a distinct account of the "sexual" part. To illustrate, let's return to the example from the Illinois State Fair. Stopping the Zipper at the top and exposing NC's body to the public without her permission violated her bodily integrity. In addition, because of the background sexist, conservative culture of the U.S. Midwest (where public displays of female nudity are considered indecent and/or shameful), it is, as Hay correctly maintains, a case of sexual harassment. But there remains an important distinction between the sexual harassment and sexual oppression. Sexual oppression focuses not primarily on the interaction between the two parties (NC and the men controlling the ride), but on the way in which bystanders relate to the interaction. Importantly here, none of the public witnessing the event reacted to it. Since no one intervened or shamed the harassers, they thereby affirmed the harassers' sexist assumption that they could get away with their wrongdoing with public support or at least without public redress. This interaction between the bystanders and the men running the Zipper involved wrongdoing by all of them, and illustrate well how sexually oppressive cultures and institutions work.

My main point is that the relation between the men and NC and the relation of the bystanders to the interaction between the men and NC should be analyzed in different ways. First, there is a case of harassment of the sexual kind, and so analyzing it requires a focus on the bilateral relation between the men and NC. Moreover, this analysis must take into account the background sexist culture that makes it a case of sexual harassment rather than some other type of harassment. In contrast, the analysis of the relation of bystanders to the interaction between the men and NC should start from the assumption that the problem is inherently a public or systemic one tracking what we in Kantianese can call "omnilateral relations" or relations between many. Because it is a systemic problem, it is also not something one person can simply choose to change as a single individual. Hence, in an analysis of oppression, we cannot move quite as easily as Hay tends to do between an analysis of sexual harassment and one of sexual oppression, including the analyses of our obligations in both cases.

To use an easier example, imagine that one day in the office while no one is looking my male colleague taps my butt. I turn around, grab his hand twisting it until he screams in pain. I then look right into his eyes and say, "You do that one more time, and I'll break your fingers!" He never bothers me again. In this case, I've stopped his sexual harassment, but it's unlikely I've done much to stop sexual oppression by so doing. For he might be tapping other women's butts or move on to women less able to resist. To address the sexual oppression, I would, for example, have to take him to court or, with the support of others (good colleagues, friends, newspapers etc.), make fully public his behavior and the (here presumed) culture of my university that supports it. In other words, sexual harassment is not necessarily an instance of sexual oppression although sexual harassment is only possible under conditions of sexual oppression, and, as Hay emphasizes, sexual harassment can reinforce these sexist, oppressive conditions. Moreover, both types of wrongdoing (harassment and oppression) involve a duty to resist because not resisting is to choose not to try to stop a moral wrong from occurring. I return to this point shortly. For now, however, simply notice that the more complex analysis needs a distinction between individual wrongdoing and systemic wrongdoing -- a distinction that we can find in Kant if we look to the "Doctrine of Right". This brings us to the second point mentioned above, the assumptions underwriting the reinterpretation of the duty to resist as an imperfect duty.

Second, in my view, oppression is not "just" an ethical issue, but also an issue of justice (what Kant calls "right"). So, as a matter of Kant interpretation, I believe that the more complete analysis of sexual harassment and sexual oppression (and the duty to resist) will incorporate an account of Kant's "Doctrine of Right" as well as an analysis of how this account fits with his account of ethics, including his distinction between perfect and imperfect duties. In the current version of Hay's theory, there is little attention paid to the "Doctrine of Right" (and the related secondary literature) or to how her current account of self-respect fits with it. Moreover, her current account places much emphasis on viewing self-respect as an imperfect duty. This revised account of self-respect is the main "comprehensive" move Hay suggests (against Rawls) that a Kantian theory of justice needs in order to analyze the problem of sexual oppression. Since this move is so important to her project, showing the compatibility between it and Kant's "Doctrine of Right" appears central. Moreover, if we try to do this on Hay's behalf (since she does not do it), there arises the problem that Kant, in the "Doctrine of Right", insists (for good reasons) that imperfect duties necessarily fall outside the scope of right. In the very least, it seems necessary to maintain that such an imperfect duty cannot be understood as enforceable, that is, it does not track punishable culpability. But then it cannot also be what explains any legal (coercive) measures to protect everyone's right not to be oppressed.

Hence, it's hard for me to see how seeing self-respect as an imperfect duty can perform such a core function in a Kantian theory of justice, or alternatively as part of a fuller account of oppression that includes both ethics and justice. Alternatively, Hay's current account leaves me wondering what role a duty of self-respect can play in a liberal theory of justice that is fundamentally committed to the idea that individuals have a right to set and pursue ends of their own, including imprudent ends, as well as a right to consent to be harmed in many ways? And since there is latitude involved in the corresponding duty to resist, who should decide when one is culpable and when one is not? Finally, it seems to me that Hay's current analysis of oppression doesn't utilize what some so-called republican interpreters regard as one of the core insights in the "Doctrine of Right". According to these interpretations, the analysis of the legal rights individuals hold against one another (private right), and so the wrongs they can do against one another, is not coextensive with the analysis of the legal rights citizens hold against their public institutions (and so the wrongs that are inherently systemic in nature). My suggestion is that such a distinction between different kinds of rights (and corresponding wrongdoings) is exactly what we Kantians need in order to analyze the distinction between particular instances of sexual harassment (a case covered under private right) and the systemic wrongs involved in sexual oppression (a case covered under public right).

Let me turn to a quick reflection on Hay's third assumption, her understanding that the "ought implies can" principle restricts the Kantian framework. Briefly, my suggestion is that another piece of Kant's "Doctrine of Right", his understanding of "doing wrong in the highest degree," may be helpful to Hay. Kant introduces this idea at the end of the "Doctrine of Private Right", where he argues that it is possible, sometimes, not to wrong anyone in particular, but still to do wrong in general. How to understand Kant here is highly controversial, but it seems to me that looking to some of these interpretations may give Hay what she needs to make sense of how sexual harassment and oppression often involves situations in which there is no morally good or unproblematic way out for individuals subjected to it. In cases of sexual harassment where the victims are powerless, we do not wrong ourselves (since we're not the ones doing the harassing), and yet we experience it as coming at a moral cost to do the only thing we can do, which is to take it. Moreover, when we live in sexist societies, we cannot do what we think is morally required, namely to end it right now (since we currently lack the power to change it). Yet even though it is not our fault and we do what we can, we also experience our inaction as coming at a moral cost or with a special kind of moral regret. In both cases, because we can't do the right thing, we can't be obliged to do it (there is no "ought" in the normal sense). Yet, doing nothing also seems wrong; it offends one's moral conscience and makes it hard to live with. This idea, I believe, is fruitful to explore as Hay continues to develop her Kantian accounts of sexual harassment and oppression.