Kant's Critique of Pure Reason: A Critical Guide

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James R. O'Shea (ed.), Kant's Critique of Pure Reason: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 297pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107074811.

Reviewed by James Messina, University of Wisconsin-Madison


This book is the newest installment in the Cambridge Critical Guides series, which aims to "serv[e] the twin tasks of introduction and exploration" (1). Its fourteen chapters skew towards the latter task; they present cutting-edge research by scholars at various stages of their careers on some central themes and arguments of the first Critique. Different chapters can be fruitfully compared with regard to both content and general approach. On the latter point, for example, some authors are particularly concerned to view Kant's ideas against the background of his predecessors' positions, while others focus on the internal dynamics of his views, and yet others underscore the relationship between his ideas and contemporary philosophy. Another example: one author (Allais) defends "reading the Critique forward" (47) -- by which she means reading the Transcendental Analytic in light of the Aesthetic -- while another (Conant) defends the opposite strategy (129-130). The volume cannot be reproached for one-sidedness. Its structure loosely tracks the organization of the first Critique, though some early chapters bear on later sections of Kant's book, while some later chapters bear on earlier sections. Rather than attempt to serially summarize each chapter -- as the editor, James O'Shea, does in his clear introduction -- I will instead organize my discussion around what I take to be some of the central themes of the volume (and, for that matter, the Critique itself), highlighting, comparing, and evaluating just a few of the claims and approaches within the space allotted me.

Sensibility and Understanding

Kant holds that the cognitive faculties of sensibility and understanding are distinct in kind rather than degree, though he also thinks they cooperate closely. Eric Watkins focuses on the distinctness thesis. He offers a novel account of the nature of each faculty and argues that Kant has principled reasons for maintaining that they "cannot exchange their functions" (A51/B75).[1] This is contrary to interpretations that take this to be a mere assumption. Watkins finds Kant's official definitions of sensibility and understanding in the first Critique misleading, since, taken literally, they would contradict Kant's position that the pure intuitions of space and time are sensible representations (21). For Watkins, the faculties are distinct in kind insofar as:

they are responsible for representations that have different and in fact irreducible representational characters, which allow sensible and discursive clarity, respectively, and because they fulfill different functions within cognition insofar as, unlike the understanding, sensibility allows for objects to be given to us in intuition in such a way that we are immediately aware of the existence of objects and can provide evidence that our understanding's judgments actually refer to what exists (10).

Lucy Allais offers a somewhat complementary take in her chapter, which is one of the gems of the volume. She argues that intuitions should not be construed as images, but rather as representations that directly acquaint us with objects. Intuitions are dependent for their existence on existing objects, so hallucinatory intuitions are impossible (50; 57). This metaphysics of intuitions would explain why, as on Watkins' view, intuitions provide evidence for the existence of objects. (Yet one question for Watkins and Allais' account is whether and how it can accommodate Kant's view that our pure intuitions of space and of mathematical objects, in contrast to empirical intuitions, do not concern existing things.)

Allais claims further that intuitions, which are "singular" representations (A320/B377), do not depend on concepts or on synthesis to present us with unitary particulars (51-52). This runs counter to what is sometimes called the "conceptualist" reading of Kant, which takes intuitions to depend crucially on the understanding. While non-conceptualists tend to play up the distinctness thesis, conceptualists often play up the cooperation thesis, as Kenneth Westphal does (189-191). Lisa Shabel's excellent chapter bears on this debate at least indirectly. She maintains that sensibility and the imagination play a key role in the pure mathematical construction of shapes prior to and independent of the understanding (170; 172). She suggests that the mathematical categories and principles of the understanding only come to play a substantive role subsequently, in the application of mathematics to objects of empirical intuition qua constituents of objective possible experience. All this is in line with the non-conceptualist view.

By contrast, James Conant advocates a sophisticated version of the conceptualist reading, according to which sensibility does not make "a self-standingly intelligible contribution" to cognition apart from the understanding (120). While intuitions do not have propositional content, they nevertheless have a kind of synthetic, categorial unity (135-138). Conant argues that this reading provides the best resolution of a connected set of puzzles about the first Critique, including the infamous problem of the two steps of the B-Deduction and the relationship between the accounts of sensibility found in the Aesthetic and the Deduction. It is not fully obvious, though, that proponents of the non-conceptualist view cannot provide equally compelling solutions. It is also not fully obvious how Conant means to deal with the various considerations that have led a number of recent commentators to conclude that the sort of unity given in an intuition -- especially the unity of space -- could not be a consequence of categorial synthesis.

Other aspects of Kant's treatment of the categories are explored in Barry Stroud and Michael Wolff's chapters. The former provides a clear, engaging overview of the general philosophical problem concerning the objective validity of the categories, though he unfortunately abstracts from many messy but crucial details of the Deduction, including all reference to 'synthesis.' Wolff offers an extremely painstaking account, replete with fascinating details, of the precision of Kant's table of judgments, though some readers might perhaps run into the opposite problem of losing the philosophical forest in all the trees.

Knowledge and Skepticism

It is no secret that the first Critique contains a sophisticated account of the conditions of knowledge and cognition -- notions which some of the authors (in line with a recent trend in Kant scholarship) are careful to distinguish -- and a much-vaunted response to skepticism. Andrew Chignell argues that givenness in intuition, which Allais and Watkins take to be fundamental for cognition, is not fundamental for knowledge (263-65). Instead, for Chignell, knowledge requires that the subject be in a position to demonstrate the real possibility of the objects that figure in a candidate proposition for knowledge (268). A subject is able to do this if she is "able to justifiably claim that [the object's] real possibility positively coheres with her background knowledge of nature and its laws" (276). Kant's epistemology thus involves a "coherentist constraint" (261). For his part, Westphal emphasizes how Kant's epistemology is tied to a cognitive semantics and psychology. He explores, inter alia, Kant's views on the conditions of "cognitive significance" (190); Kant's solution to the "binding problem" (186), a topic that Allais treats rather differently (52); and the anti-Cartesian strands in Kant thinking, such as his rejection of an infallibilist standard of justification (201).

Stroud and, to some extent, Westphal follow Peter Strawson's The Bounds of Sense in taking the Transcendental Deduction to be, or at least to begin, an anti-skeptical argument that proceeds from self-consciousness to the necessity of objective representation and knowledge of an external world (110; 197-200). Whether or not this interpretation is correct -- some Kant scholars, such as Karl Ameriks, have expressed skepticism -- there is no doubt that Kant intends the Refutation of Idealism to be an anti-skeptical argument. Ralf Bader's chapter offers clear and persuasive answers to the main questions of the Refutation: What sort of skepticism is at issue? What is the meaning and justification of the argument's central assumptions? Bader argues that Kant is concerned to address, not the most radical kinds of skepticism (e.g., those that doubt the existence of past mental states), but rather the kinds that grant the existence of inner experience and privilege it over outer experience. On Bader's reading, Kant's starting assumption is that inner states can be objectively ordered in time (208-210). Kant holds that this possibility presupposes that there is some outer permanent thing of which one can have outer experience. The permanent thing cannot be something inner, as Bader explains, because we can prove permanence only of material substance (217-218). As for which representations of particular outer objects are veridical, we need to consider whether and how they cohere with other representations and the a priori rules of experience, a process which does not allow for or require certainty (220). In underscoring the coherentist, fallibilist strands in the Refutation, Bader's account chimes with some of Westphal and Chignell's claims.

Mathematics and Space

Both Allais and Shabel emphasize the sometimes overlooked fact that the Aesthetic does not contain Kant's full-blown philosophy of mathematics. Shabel explores how Kant supplements his account in the Analytic of Principles. She helpfully sorts out the various principles that figure in Kant's philosophy of geometry. There are principles of pure mathematics, an expansive category that includes Euclid's postulates and other geometric propositions, as well as non-propositional acts of imagining shapes and diagramming spaces; principles of pure sensibility: space and time as infinite, singular wholes that "warrant and constrain" (171) the previously mentioned acts and propositions; and mathematical principles of pure understanding -- e.g., "all intuitions are extensive magnitudes" (B202) -- which guide the application of mathematics to objects of possible experience.

On Allais' interpretation, the ideality of space amounts to the claim that space and the objects in it do not exist independent of the possibility of being presented to minds like ours (61-62). She reconstructs one of Kant's explicit arguments for this position. Michela Massimi, in her rich and provocative chapter, explores an argument that is largely implicit in the first Critique (though it becomes explicit in the second): if space is as Newton says it is, then the consequence is Spinozism, i.e., the view that we are mere accidents of a divine substance that necessitates our actions. As she points out, it is not immediately clear why Kant takes the Newtonian view to have this consequence. Particularly puzzling is the assumption that the Newtonian equation of absolute space with God's omnipresence would make God/space a "determining ground" (72). Massimi argues that:

the real motivation for the ideality of space -- in the argument from Spinozism -- should not be sought in Kant's engagement with a broadly Newtonian view, after all. His real motivation is instead downstream to a wider metaphysical view about God, space, and the world that Kant came to elaborate in the 1770's, in response to both occasionalism and Leibnizian pre-established harmony (74).

The view Kant came to elaborate is that noumenal substances really interact as members of a single world in virtue of their relation to God, while phenomenal substances stand in merely apparent interaction as members of a merely phenomenal world in virtue of their relation to space, which is the phenomenon of divine omnipresence (78). Massimi's interpretation quite rightly calls attention to some unexpected theological and cosmological underpinnings of the ideality thesis. (One might wonder, though, whether the argument from Spinozism is more directly rooted in Kant's engagement with, and understanding of, specific aspects of Newton's metaphysics of space than Massimi's account suggests. In this regard, it is perhaps noteworthy that in a variety of texts Kant alludes to a view of space that, he thinks, renders space unduly dictatorial and "determining," and there are some indications that he specifically has the Newtonians in mind [AA 2:406-407; A431/B459; AA 4:321-322].)

Self-Knowledge and Self-Consciousness

In the preface, Kant characterizes the first Critique as an attempt on reason's part to gain "self-knowledge," by which he seems to mean knowledge about the possibility and extent of a priori knowledge (Axi). Elsewhere, he explores the structure of self-consciousness and criticizes efforts to draw from that structure specific metaphysical conclusions about our nature as things-in-themselves. Stephen Engstrom's chapter on the Copernican Revolution bears on the self-knowledge of the preface, as well as Kant's treatment of self-consciousness. Since the method of the Critique precludes reliance on uncertain suppositions, according to Engstrom (32-33), Kant must take the Copernican view to have an unimpeachable basis: it must be "implicated in theoretical cognition's basic self-understanding," while the traditional view rests on a "self-misunderstanding" (35). ("Theoretical cognition" here apparently refers both to the self-scrutinizing reason of the preface and the self-conscious I of the Deduction.) Organism-like, human cognition is a "self-sustaining, self-productive activity," (36) but as finite it depends on an external condition to enable its "spontaneous growth" (38). This entails that cognition determines its object, rather than vice-versa -- though this does not mean the object depends on cognition for its existence, pace some treatments of the Copernican Revolution (43). One worry here is that, in claiming that Kant holds the Copernican view to be part of "cognition's self-conception," Engstrom is arguably discounting its status as an "experiment" (Bxviii). Relatedly, it may be that the truth of the Copernican approach to cognition is in some sense part of reason's self-knowledge, but that need not mean that it can be deduced from the 'I think,' as Engstrom seems to imply (36). On the contrary, Kant suggests that its truth is supposed to be vindicated by the overall coherence of the philosophical system built around it.

Patricia Kitcher's illuminating chapter explores the 'I think' both with regard to the nature of the unitary self-consciousness that Kant thinks it indicates and with regard to its "emptiness," (A345-46/B403-4) which he claims thwarts the efforts of rational psychologists to establish metaphysical conclusions about the I. She offers a new model of Kant's thinker: it is a set of mental states that are (or can be) necessarily connected to each other (156). The necessary connectedness of mental states is achieved through acts of synthesis, and is intimately bound up with all rational cognitive activity. The emptiness of the 'I think' amounts to the fact that it is not applied on the basis of an intuition of the I, nor on the basis of any marks contained in representations (155). While Engstrom's account plays up some of the headier aspects of Kant's treatment of self-consciousness, which nourished the speculative adventures of later German idealists, Kitcher takes pains to make it seem like good philosophical sense, which is no small feat. However, some might object that Kitcher's interpretation discounts some possible indications that Kant's thinker is not (or not merely) a result of synthesis, but also a noumenal substance with powers (as Julian Wuerth argues in his recent book, Kant on Mind, Action, and Ethics.)

Reason and the Supersensible

Kant holds that reason gets ensnared in dialectical illusion when it trespasses beyond the limits of experience. Yet he also regards ideas of supersensible, noumenal entities as to some degree defensible and indispensable. Graham Bird's chapter on the antinomies provides a helpful look at the significance of reason's principle -- "if the conditioned is given, then the whole sum of conditions, and hence the absolutely unconditioned, is also given" (A409/B436) -- and the role it plays in generating the idea of the physical universe as an absolute totality. Just as the principle only applies to supersensible noumena, so does the latter idea, though it is easily confused with the scientifically legitimate concept of an empirical physical universe as a comparative whole (233). The antinomies, like other dialectical inferences, trade on the ambiguity of phenomena and noumena, which is why transcendental idealism is a salve (232). Bird's treatment of the resolution of the Third Antinomy, wherein Kant seems to commit himself to a daring metaphysics of noumenal freedom, is provocative. He argues that noumenal freedom is nothing but a "fantasy" that figures in a purely defensive argument and that Kant is not committed to a separate realm of supersensible, noumenal entities, not even for the instantiation of moral properties (236-241).

By contrast, Chignell and John Callanan emphasize in different ways the various respects in which Kant is committed to a positive metaphysics of the supersensible. As Chignell notes, Kant not only allows in the Doctrine of Method for faith and hope in God and immortality on practical grounds, he also allows that "doctrinal" forms of theoretically-based belief in these matters are fully rational. Chignell argues that this oft-neglected section of the Critique contains not just a negative lesson about the dangers of using reason beyond the bounds of experience but also an acknowledgement of the indispensability of "beloved metaphysics" (277-279). Callanan's chapter explores Kant's account of the theoretical sources of the idea of God, as developed in the Ideal of Pure Reason and the second half of the appendix to the Dialectic. Kant holds that the nature of our mind and its interests play a crucial role in leading theoretical reason to the idea of God and to specific beliefs about the divine nature. Callanan rightly calls attention to the puzzling fact that, though some of Kant's contemporaries and successors thought that linking the idea of God to our needs engenders suspicion of this idea, Kant himself thinks it somehow confirms the idea's legitimacy. Adding to the puzzle, Kant regards a certain degree of personification of the original being as rationally warranted, as Callanan shows, despite the fact that he agrees with Hume that it is an "anthropomorphic projection" (253)! Neither Chignell's nor Callanan's chapter sets out to answer all the questions and puzzles about the positive theoretical role of ideas of the supersensible, but they correct a certain view of Kant and will likely serve as building blocks for future research.


The individual essays of this volume are of high quality and fit together well, even when -- or perhaps especially when -- they defend contradictory positions on a given issue. Unfortunately, the volume's concentration on a relatively circumscribed set of themes means that some ideas (e.g., the analytic-synthetic distinction) and even whole sections of the Critique (e.g., the second and fourth Antinomies, the Schematism, and the Amphiboly) get relatively short shrift. While the restricted breadth somewhat limits the value of the book as an introduction to the first Critique, I think this is more than outweighed by its depth. This will be a book that Kant scholars will want to read.


Thanks to Kim Brewer for feedback on an earlier draft.

[1] References to the first Critique are given according to the standard A/B pagination. References to other works by Kant are to the Akademie Ausgabe (cited with AA followed by volume and page number).