Kant's Lectures on Ethics: A Critical Guide

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Lara Denis and Oliver Sensen (eds.), Kant's Lectures on Ethics: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 289pp., $102.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107036314.

Reviewed by Alice Pinheiro Walla, University of Bayreuth


"Kant's lectures on Ethics" is the umbrella term for a collection of student notes taken between the early 1760s to around 1794. This excellent collection of scholarly essays focuses on the sets of notes which are partially available in translation in the Cambridge Edition of Kant's Lectures on Ethics (Herder, Collins, Mrongovius II, and Vigilantius, named after the students who took the notes).

Using these lecture notes can be tricky: first, they are far from being complete and reliable accounts of Kant's teaching (just imagine having to rely on student notes!). Probably only one set of notes was taken during Kant's lectures (the pre-critical Herder lecture notes, which are quite elliptical). Other sets were copied from or supplemented with earlier lecture notes (Werner Stark has argued that the Kaehler lecture notes, not available in English translation, is the most reliable set). Secondly, one must be careful not to conflate the content of these notes with Kant's mature ethical thought (Kant's views were still "work in progress" in some earlier sets of notes). Thirdly, without background knowledge of the context of the lectures, the reader will hardly be able to guess who Kant is addressing with his comments and objections, and why he concentrates on specific concepts and topics in his lectures. For example, Kant had to base his lectures on government approved textbooks, and chose Baumgarten for this purpose. However, he rarely names his "author". To complicate matters further, the German Academy Edition abounds with editorial mistakes; the English translation, based on this edition, is no less problematic (some contributions in this volume make the reader aware of this problem).

However, when used with caution and appropriate background knowledge, the lecture notes can offer unrivalled insight into the context and development of Kant's ethical and moral thought, and complement Kant's often reticent expositions in the mature published works. This volume is thus an invaluable compass for navigating these complex materials, and essential to anyone interested in Kant's ethical and moral thought.

Stefano Bacin explains how Kant's lectures reflect his critical dialogue with Baumgarten's moral philosophy. The lectures were based on Baumgarten's Initia philosophiae practicae primae (1760) and Ethica philosophica (1740). Bacin shows that far from offering a mere commentary on Baumgarten, Kant critically engaged with Baumgarten's ethical concepts and that this shaped the development of his own moral theory. Themes such as the Wollfian-Baumgartian connection between action and motives, and the idea of an internal determination of the agent's will, as well as Baumgarten's care to differentiate perfection from happiness (a main rupture with the Wolffian tradition) were particularly interesting to Kant. It was in Baumgarten that Kant first discovered the concept of an imperative. But Kant also understood the shortcomings of Baumgarten's theory: tautological principles which expressed merely the imperative modality of obligation, but did not ground obligation as such; the lack of differentiation between motives, as well as a vague concept of perfection, which made it unfit as the basis of morality. Also, Baumgarten's failure to acknowledge the moral status of human beings and the role of self-esteem as the basis of certain duties were points of disagreement. I found this article very instructive, and one of the most helpful in this volume.

Kant's evolving and clearly ambiguous views on the relationship between morality and religion is a recurring theme in his lectures on ethics, and also in this volume. Patrick R. Frierson examines the role of religion for moral motivation in the Herder lecture notes, which show the early stages of Kant's ethical thought. While Kant was clear that moral motivation had to be pure (not based on self-interest), he nevertheless wanted God to provide at least an indirect motivation to morality. Religion would thus function as a complement to one's moral perfection, given our human limitations. Kant goes to great lengths to account for the possibility of being motivated by obedience to God while avoiding self-interested fear of God. The conclusion mentions a highly topical issue which unfortunately is not explored in the article: how the Herder notes show Kant's preoccupation with how religious thinking went astray as fanaticism and religious intolerance (50).

Manfred Kuehn draws a fascinating parallel between the parts of the Collins lectures covering Baumgarten's "universal practical philosophy" and the foundational concerns of the Groundwork and second Critique, as well as between the second part of the lectures dealing with Baumgarten's Ethica, and the more substantive topics of the late Doctrine of Virtue. A related point is made by Robert B. Louden, who stresses the shift in Kant's thought in the early 1790s from purely rational beings to human beings, as illustrated by the Vigilantius lecture and the Metaphysics of Morals.

Kuehn also uses the pre-critical Collins notes to elucidate Kant's controversial conception of the highest good in the second Critique. Although we can act morally without the help of God, Kant surprisingly argues that in order to conceive the highest good, we must nevertheless postulate the existence of God and the immortality of the soul, a move that has been deemed an inappropriate eudaemonistic concession in his moral theory. According to Kuehn, it is not "that Kant felt it necessary to reinvent God (for his servant Lampe) in the second Critique after he had put him to rest in the first. . . . God was always there for him in the background." (67). The "background" was Kant's critical analysis of Baumgarten's moral theory. Although for Baumgarten theology and faith played a prominent role both in moral motivation and in the foundations of morality, Kant became gradually aware of the need to restrict the role of God and faith in moral theory.

Jens Timmermann warns about the precarious condition of the current editions of the Mrongovius II lecture notes. While the Academy Edition (vol. 29) has severe editorial mistakes, the English translation is an "inaccurate partial translation of an error ridden edition of patchy student notes" (69). But there are excellent reasons for devoting attention to these lecture notes: central themes of the Groundwork, which are only briefly explained, are at times developed there in greater detail. Mrongovius II (the second set of lectures) is the only set of ethics notes in which the concept of autonomy, the great innovation of the Groundwork of 1785, is mentioned (autonomy is also mentioned in Naturrecht Feyerabend, a lecture on natural law from 1784). Although certain views found in Mrongovius are abandoned in the Groundwork (for instance, the view that God is the creator of the obligation to obey the moral law by rewarding virtue with happiness, 78), Kant's deep concern with the relationship between happiness and virtue is constant. If morality completely excluded the possibility of happiness (as a conceptual truth, not merely contingently), we would have a strong case against morality in our lives. While Kant is realistic about the likelihood of virtue and happiness coinciding in a unjust world, he nevertheless wants to account for the possibility of happiness for those who deserve it.

Stephen Engstrom revisits the Collins lecture notes and argues that Kant saw himself as agreeing with the Ancients in the importance of integrating happiness in his account of the virtuous life. Unfortunately, Engstrom does not specify which "Ancients" Kant is referring to. Although he draws some parallels between Kant, Plato and Aristotle, the comparison remains vague. Further, he does not explain how to reconcile his thesis with the passages in which Kant openly criticizes the Ancients for conflating virtue and happiness under the notion of the summum bonum. Finally, the reader is left wondering how one can conclude from these lectures that the will is a "cognitive capacity" (115).

Allen Wood refutes the widespread view that Kant's philosophy was ahistorical, and that he had no knowledge of the history of philosophy. One must know "where to look" to understand how Kant regarded his own theory as historically embedded, and for his views on history of philosophy. Kant's lectures on ethics are optimal for this purpose, since he usually began his lectures with a brief survey of the history of ethics. Wood reconstructs a number of Kant's "historical theses", according to which the ancients were concerned with the summum bonum and the moderns with principles. While the Stoics and the Epicureans failed to draw a clear distinction between virtue and happiness and offered an ethical ideal for emulation, Platonism and Christianity emerged as first forms of anti-eudaemonism, and paved the way to an ethics of principles. Kant conceives this as a "progress" in the history of philosophy, and regarded his own moral theory as embedded in this historical philosophical development.

Oliver Sensen's article offers a useful reconstruction of the main task of Kant's moral theory: to account for the unconditional bindingness of moral requirements. Very early on, Kant realized that morality requires necessitation as opposed to natural necessity; that it must involve compulsion (Zwang), since it deals with a will that does not automatically conform to morality; and, importantly, that the binding character of morality must be internal to the will of the agent, and not imposed by the will of another. A few questions arise from Sensen's reconstruction. Explaining why Kant considered Baumgarten's distinction between active and passive obligation irrelevant, Sensen argues that "in claiming a right (active obligation), one is reminding the other agent "of his own duty to obey the law of his own reason" (passive obligation). However, this does not explain the difference between claiming a right and merely reminding an agent that she has a duty of virtue (perhaps to help someone, with no corresponding right by the beneficiary). Further, when discussing Kant's criticism of heteronomous theories, it is not clear why rationalist theories (moral perfectionism) would be based in desires. According to Sensen, Kant's answer is that to perfect oneself can only mean developing one's talents; since talents can only become our motives by means of the happiness we expect from them, they presuppose desires (148). But this would only work if we assume that perfection is about non-moral perfection. But what about moral perfection? Why would striving towards moral perfection necessarily be desire motivated?

The next two articles throw light on central aspects of Kant's legal theory. B. Sharon Byrd explains why there are only three types of permissive laws in Kant's legal theory based on the logical relations of the deontic hexagon. Since there are only three types of permitted actions (not prohibited, not required, and indifferent), there can be only three types of permissive laws. A permissive law may justify (1) an exception to a prohibitory norm (as in the Vigilantius lecture notes); (2) an exception to a prescriptive norm (such as the permission to defer political reform in "Perpetual Peace") and (3) as a power conferring norm (as in the expansion of innate right to possession of external objects in ยง2 of the Doctrine of Right). This article is extremely illuminating given disagreements in the literature concerning Kant's permissive laws.

Joachim Hruschka explores the logic of imputation in Vigilantius, Kaehler lecture notes and later published works. Kant follows the tradition of Wolff and Gottfried Achenwall in linking moral responsibility to the notion of causa libera, a free cause which determines one's action. Imputation is not a mere ascription of an act to an agent (imputatio facti), but the imputation of a law (imputatio legis). In order to be considered responsible for a certain effect, one must be (morally) free to prevent it or bring it about (one must be physically able too, but as Hruschka argues there are two senses of freedom we need to distinguish. 'Moral' is my addition to make this distinction clear). Imputation can be excluded when there is physical impossibility, but also when there are asymmetrical grounds of obligation in a "conflict" of moral reasons. Take the example of C, who can only save one of two simultaneously drowning persons A and B. C saves B, who is her minor child. As Hruschka argues, the death of A cannot be imputed to C. The reason is that C was not free to save A; as the parent of B, she had a duty to save B instead. (Readers may wonder if Kant would allow giving preference to one's own child over a stranger in this case. However, it would not be a matter of preference, but of a special obligation towards one's child, which Kant does recognize). The rule ultra posse nemur obligatur, no one has a duty beyond her capabilities, is thus ambiguous (179). We must be able to distinguish two senses of "not free".

Presupposing his own interpretation of Kant's moral theory as being about maximizing our freedom to set our own ends (with which I disagree), Paul Guyer argues that all duties "can be derived from the concept of freedom combined with some basic facts about the human condition that bear on the realization of freedom" (190). While it is true that every duty can somehow be connected to the idea of freedom, Guyer's attempt to derive every duty from a concern to maximize freedom leads him to ignore the subtleties of Kant's characterization of specific duties. For instance, certain ways of treating one's own person are undignified or humiliating, independently of their impact on one's freedom to set ends. Finally, his interpretation of friendship as "enhancing the freedom of each and of all" (203) as well as of marriage as transforming "the mere gratification of inclination into an exercise of freedom" (204) were far-fetched in my view.

Lara Denis focuses on the role of self-esteem for duties to oneself. She argues that self esteem is essentially a moral attitude: the evaluation of one's self-worth with reference to the moral law. Different types of duties to oneself display the moral attitude of self-esteem in different ways. Although I was disappointed by the lenghty compilation of passages without much analysis or commentary, Denis makes some important points. For instance, she discusses the "disturbing claims" Kant makes regarding violations of duties to the self, such as the view that a human who forfeits his standing as a person "may be treated by others however they wish" (Collins 27: 373, 346)."As we have practically denied our status as persons, we are in no position to demand that others respect us as such". However, Denis argues, this does not mean that others are authorized to treat us as they please: one remains morally obliged by one's own reason to treat persons with respect, even if they fail to respect themselves. Further, assuming they are no longer persons would be inconsistent with the idea that they have violated a duty to themselves in the first place. Only persons and not things are capable of moral obligation (221).

Anne Margaret Baxley reconstructs Kant's account of virtue as presupposing conflict and struggle, and thus a form of autocracy or moral self-governance. She stresses that this self-governance is nevertheless incompatible with tyranny over oneself, since depriving oneself of some contentment in life would be against duties to oneself. The article offers a useful reconstruction of Schiller's misunderstanding of Kant's moral theory, and Kant's subsequent response in a footnote in the Religion.

Jeanine Grenberg stresses Kant's fundamental concern that love of others be no empty well-wishing, but an effective attempt to improve others' lot. Early on, Kant's idea of love had a very pragmatic character: contenting oneself to beautiful but ineffective wishes towards others would be self-indulgent, and against morality. Grenberg shows how Kant's account evolved from a conception of love based on the well-being of the agent (Herder lecture notes) to Kant's own distinctive principle-based conception, based on moral self-esteem (Collins). I found this article very illuminating, although I disagree with the characterization of Kant's theory as "coldblooded". It seems to me that Kant's point is to put feelings in their proper place when it comes to what we owe to others.

Finally, Houston Smit and Mark Timmons explore the psychology of devilish vices in Kant: envy, ingratitude and Schadenfreude. These arise from (inappropriately) comparing oneself with others in matters of moral worth and or well-being which creates hatred towards others.