Kant's Modal Metaphysics

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Nicholas F. Stang, Kant's Modal Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2016, 352pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198712626.

Reviewed by Andrew Chignell, University of Pennsylvania


The dust jacket of this book features anatomical drawings of a narwhal and a unicorn. They are Kant's own examples: he says that we can't tell just by looking at the drawings (or considering our concepts) which of these animals actually exists. We have to go and investigate. But are we able to tell, just by considering our concepts, whether narwahls or unicorns are at least possible?

A "logicist," in Nicholas Stang's terminology, says yes: whether or not something is possible is entirely a function of the logical relations between the predicates contained in its concept. So if the concept <unicorn> contains a (hidden or explicit) contradiction, then unicorns are impossible. Conversely, if there is no contradiction among the predicates, then unicorns are possible.

A cautious logicist will be quick to note, however, that finite minds are often unable to grasp all of the predicates contained in a concept along with all of their logical relationships. So there are plenty of questions about possibility that we can't, as a matter of fact, answer from the philosopher's armchair. But we could, at least in principle.

Opponents of logicism believe that there is another domain of modality, and that its boundaries are set by what might be called metaphysical facts and principles. Facts about the essences or natures of narwahls, for instance -- together with metaphysical principles regarding which properties can be co-exemplified -- determine whether narwahls are necessary, possible, or impossible in this more restricted and more significant sense. This naturally raises questions about the status of such metaphysical principles as well as our epistemic access to them.

Stang's main goals are to show (1) that Kant was committed, throughout his career, to a domain of "real possibility" (reale Möglichkeit) -- one that cannot be characterized in terms of either causal laws or logical principles -- and (2) that this anti-logicism motivates far more of his philosophy (early and late) than is often recognized.

The book is a welcome addition, even to the vast literature on Kant. No monograph has focused entirely on this topic since Guido Schneeberger's Kants Konzeption der Modalbegriffe fell more-or-less stillborn from the press in 1952. Most books on the first Critique since then have passed over the chapter on modality in almost complete silence. Stang's work shows in an especially clear way why a few of us mid-career types, as well as many younger scholars (including Toni Kannisto, Noam Hoffer, Peter Yong, Uygar Abaci, Jessica Leech, Kimberly Brewer, and Omri Boehm), have recently found the topic worth revisiting.

Stang writes in the manner of a technical analytic philosopher, with page after page of conceptual analyses, definitions, numbered propositions, and formal arguments. His approach to the texts is explicitly rational-reconstructive: the goal, at least sometimes, is not so much to discern what the historical Leibniz or Baumgarten may have thought, but rather to see whether their writings -- souped-up and retrofitted with present-day analytical tools -- offer new and interesting "positions in logical space" (65).

The results are also unabashedly metaphysical: even after the Critical turn, Stang's Kant is committed to all manner of substantive speculative claims about fundamental reality and metaphysical modality, though not typically in the mode of knowledge.

In light of all this, I suspect that some readers -- those who are looking for an easy read, or are anachronism-phobic, or are attracted to Kant because they thought he was opposed to metaphysics -- will gnash their teeth in dismay. Others, however, will find it impossible not to appreciate the combination of rigor, clarity, and creativity on display here.

One of the important consequences of the logicist assimilation of facts about possibility to facts about logical relationships, according to Stang, is that if God necessarily exists then he must do so in virtue of "the logical containment of existence in his essence" (14). Chapter 2 comprises successive critical reconstructions of the ontological arguments developed by Descartes, Leibniz, and Baumgarten. The discussion crescendos to the conclusion that Kant's "decisive objection, the objection that will [according to Kant] finally eliminate ontological arguments, is the claim that existence is not a real predicate" (76).

Stang goes on to argue, however, that this decisive objection relies on logical and ontological assumptions that sophisticated logicists like (the souped-up retrofitted versions of) Leibniz and Baumgarten have no reason to grant (75ff). If correct, this result is significant. Philosophers influenced by Kant often reverently cite the dictum that "existence is not a real predicate" as though it delivers a straightforward refutation of Anselm, Descartes, Leibniz, et al. But impressive as the dictum sounds -- I know at least one person who has it on a bumper sticker! -- the devil (or deity, in this case) is in the details. A reader with the stamina to hack through the thicket of arguments in these chapters will come away persuaded, I think, that Kant's lifelong assault on it has little by way of probative force.

Stang's other main focus in the first part of the book is Kant's own "possibility proof" in The Only Possible Basis for a Demonstration of the Existence of God (1763). Stang offers a detailed reconstruction that differs in notable ways from others on offer (including my own). The most significant divergence has to do with the way in which God's existence serves as "ground of all real possibility" (Kant's term, which Stang abbreviates -- with an awkward nod to John Irving -- as "GARP").

Stang rejects the Leibnizian "intellectualist" picture according to which the content of God's thoughts plays the role of GARP. He also rejects (what I regard as) the attractive "exemplification" picture according to which God has the fundamental properties out of which all possibilities are logically constructed.

Stang has a more ambivalent relationship with Christian Crusius' "powers" picture, according to which God's status as GARP stems from what God can do. Stang believes that this view is philosophically coherent and that it is natural to read Kant as advocating it, as Stang himself did in a 2010 article. He is also aware of a prominent objection to it -- namely, that because divine powers consist in what God can do, they can't themselves explain what makes everything possible.

But although Stang regards this as a fatal objection against Cartesian "voluntarist" accounts of possibility (according to which God's actual choices are what ground all real possibility), he seems unfazed by it with respect to the powers picture (110-114). I find it hard to see why. What makes it the case that Sherlock Holmes is really possible, on this reading? The fact that God can create him. But what makes it the case that an omnipotent being can create Sherlock Holmes? It's tempting to think that any answer will presuppose that Holmes is really possible. But then we're running in a very tight explanatory circle. (To be fair, Stang does seem to acknowledge this in places (146).)

In any case, the later Stang's official reason for rejecting the early Stang's powers picture is textual rather than philosophical: he has now found two "proof texts" in Only Possible Basis where Kant supposedly rejects all competing accounts in favor of a view according to which "the way in which possibilities are grounded in God is literally incomprehensible to us" (118). Stang combines this new mysterianism with the claim that his earlier self was at least correct to say that, for Kant, we ought to think of real possibility as grounded in God's powers, because only that will make his possibility proof valid (145-6).

This result is clearly a position in logical space, but some difficulties remain. First, I'm not persuaded that the "proof texts" support Stang's interpretation, although I won't quibble about that here. Second, why would the pre-Critical Kant, an inveterate metaphysician who says in 1763 that he is still willing to "subscribe to" the Principle of Sufficient Reason, suddenly punt to mystery like this? And, third, would Kant really think it is legitimate for us to conceive of the grounding relation inaccurately in terms of powers, just in order to make his proof go through? One suspects that Stang is projecting Kant's first Critique doctrines of noumenal ignorance and regulative "as-if" thinking back into the pre-critical period here, but without much textual warrant.

In the second part of the book, Stang describes how Kant's attitude towards the epistemology and semantics of modality changes in the Critical period. He provides a helpful and innovative taxonomy of the kinds of modality, and ultimately agrees with those of us who believe that this newfound modal skepticism is part of what underwrites Kant's ignorance claims about things-in-themselves.

There is also a long chapter in which Stang joins the (thin but hardy) ranks of commentators who argue that the "rational faith" (Vernunftglaube) for which such ignorance is supposed to make room can be formed in response to the interests of theoretical just as much as pragmatic and moral reason. I wholeheartedly agree with him here, too: our speculative rational capacity, for Kant, directs us to seek explanatory stopping-points, fully-articulate systems, necessary truths, and sufficient reasons generally. The results, at least sometimes, will be more than mere "as if" thoughts or "regulative ideas;" in some contexts, the aims and interests of theoretical reason can underwrite full-blown assent in the mode of Vernunftglaube.

The final chapter contains an ingenious and yet still puzzling response to what Stang christens the "antinomy of modal metaphysics." In the third Critique, Kant suggests that anything God (an "intuitive intellect") represents must be actual, and thus that God doesn't represent any non-actual possibilities, and thus (given omniscience) that there are no such possibilities.

Whether or not these claims lead to a canonical antinomy, it's clear that they threaten not only the accuracy of our modal talk but also the alternative possibilities required for genuine freedom, human and divine.

What's ingenious here is Stang's suggestion that although noumena (including our noumenal selves) do not have modal properties strictly speaking, they do have "noumenal correlates" of modal properties. Specifically, they have non-modal powers that we (legitimately, somehow) represent in terms of possibility, actuality, and necessity (312-314). The fact that there are these noumenal, non-modal powers is sufficient to safeguard freedom.

What's still puzzling, especially in a book that is chock-full of analyses, is that Stang does not, as far as I can see, offer an analysis of noumenal power that does not itself invoke modal notions. Perhaps that is his point: we can only conceive of such powers in terms of what a substance or agent can do. But it remains unclear (to me at least) why the idea of a "non-modal noumenal power" is somehow legitimate and useful, rather than an empty, if inevitable, gesture that leads to explanatory circles. (One can't help but wonder when reading this chapter whether Stang, like Kant himself, finds it difficult to abandon his earlier self's published views, and so has used his formidable philosophical skills to argue himself into a difficult dialectical corner.)

Despite the unicorns on its cover, Kant's Modal Metaphysics is not bedtime reading: it contains the intricate and exhaustive results of more than a decade of painstaking work. However, it rewards close and repeated study, and it also highlights the way in which a focus on Kant's account of modality opens up new ways of thinking about his philosophy as a whole.


Thanks to Andrew Stephenson, Kimberly Brewer, and Colin McLear for helpful feedback on an earlier draft.