Kant’s Revolutionary Theory of Modality

Kant S Revolutionary Theory Of Modality

Uygar Abaci, Kant’s Revolutionary Theory of Modality, Oxford University Press, 2019, 287pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198831556.

Reviewed by Timothy Rosenkoetter, Dartmouth College


Spread out through Kant’s published writings and personal notes we find various ways in which modal concepts and properties are said to be extraordinary. In many of these passages Kant tells us that what sets possibility, existence, and necessity apart from non-modal properties is their relationality. How to cash this out is very much open to debate, but at least part of the idea seems to be that modal properties somehow involve the relation of subjects to objects. Substantial progress in reconstructing Kant’s modal theory has been made in recent years, due in no small part to Nick Stang’s Kant’s Modal Metaphysics (2016). Prior to the present work, though, no monograph has made Kant’s often puzzling claims regarding  relationality central to his theory. Some interpreters suspect that these claims are ill-considered or at least peripheral to Kant’s core doctrines. In contrast, Uygar Abaci takes them fully seriously and sets out to fashion an interpretation that gives them pride of place. In my view, it’s high time that Kant’s readers take up this challenge (and a challenge it is, as we will see). It is against this background that this comprehensive, highly informative, well-researched, and frequently lucid book is a welcome arrival.

The book is divided into three parts. The first covers the positions and the arguments of the tradition that are most relevant, focusing on Anselm, Descartes, Leibniz, and Wolff, but including substantial material on other figures such as Aquinas and Baumgarten. The exposition is clear and helpful, and this part of the book strikes just the right balance, giving the reader enough background, while not, in effect, amounting to its own, separate tome. One highlight of these reconstructions is the author’s case that neither Leibniz nor Wolff accepts a logicist account of modality. The author’s take on Wolff is particularly noteworthy and innovative.

The book’s second part covers Kant’s pre-critical theory, which Abaci judges “revisionary” though not revolutionary. The third and largest part provides an interpretation of Kant’s mature theory, according to which modal properties are not simply properties of things, but the three fundamental “ways in which the conceptual representations of things are related to the cognitive subject” (5). It is the fundamentally relational nature of modality that makes Kant’s mature theory revolutionary and prompts the book’s title. My focus here will be on the key decisions that Abaci makes in reconstructing this relationality. Partly in order to provide a taxonomic tool to help track various candidate versions of relationality, and partly because it makes a cut at a significant point, I suggest that we group candidate relations into two different types. The first genus is characterized by relata that are both intra-subjective, as for example in the relation that a proposition under consideration by S bears to other propositions that this subject already accepts. The second genus is composed of relations of subject to object, as in the relation that might be thought to obtain when a subject asserts that a proposition is true. At various points Abaci’s reading makes both types of relations fundamental to modality, without calling attention to the difference or treating it as important.[1] Now, it may turn out that the inclusion of both at the ground level mirrors Kant’s own thinking. Yet if a philosophical position that places both at its base is unstable, as I suspect it is, then it is worth our while to figure out whether we can make sense of Kant as choosing one of them over the other as the basis for his modal theory. My bet is that subject-object relationality is fundamental to Kant’s model, while cases in which intra-subjective relationality seems to be fundamental can be explained as building in some way upon the former. Should I turn out to be wrong, the contrast will at least help bring Abaci’s proposal into relief.

The agenda for the book’s first two parts is set by two of the most important moves made in The Only Possible Ground of Proof for a Demonstration of the Existence of God (OPA), the 1763 essay that did more than any other pre-critical work to make a name for Kant. The first of these is the Negative Thesis: the famous denial that existence is a “real predicate,” which means, somewhat less famously, that it is not a predicate that expresses reality in the technical sense of quiddity. The second is the Actualist Principle: the claim that each real predicate F of a real possible thing is grounded in something existing that instantiates F (or instantiates a property F*, which itself grounds F). The two chapters that comprise Part II aim to show how Kant uses the Negative Thesis to undercut the traditional ontological argument (Ch. 3) and fashions an alternative argument for the existence of God that rests on the Actualist Principle (Ch. 4). Abaci takes the former to highlight the pre-critical Kant’s revisionist (but not yet revolutionary) views on existence, and the latter to do the same with respect to possibility and necessity.

Chapter 3 takes an uncompromising line on how we should understand the Negative Thesis. Contrary to those who treat existence as an extraordinary property because all objects possess it, Abaci’s Kant rigorously insists that it is not the property of any object (92–3). Positively, Kant holds:

SEC: Existence is a “predicate” (property) of concepts; and

POS: Existential judgments are absolute positings.

By itself, SEC does not tell us which property existence is, just that it is second-order. Abaci, like nearly everyone who interprets Kant as holding SEC, takes Kant to hold the view that Bolzano, Russell, and Frege will later develop:

SEC*: existential propositions affirm that the subject-concept is instantiated.

The overwhelming popularity of this particular specification of SEC should not blind us to the crucial contribution of the concept <instantiated>. After all, SEC could instead be specified by adding the second-order properties willed by God or figuring in a possible cognition based upon perception.[2] In any case, SEC* is the key Kantian claim on Abaci’s reading, since in his reconstruction “absolute positing” ends up being nothing more than a technical term for the second-level predication of the property of being instantiated.

Abaci presents three theses as following upon Kant’s key claim. First, SEC* “makes a reference to the cognitive subject and the faculty of conceptual representation in explicating the meaning of existence” (94). Second, SEC* implies that “existential assertions connect the conceptual representation of an object with the perception of that object outside (or distinct from) that representation” (94). (Note the invocation of subject-object relationality.) Third, the second point implies that these assertions are “bound by epistemic conditions,” in particular, by the subject’s epistemic access to those objects. Now, it might be that the author of OPA already holds these, each of which will later play a role in his critical project. If so, though, we need something more than, or different from, SEC*, since none of them actually follows from it.

The first thesis invites comparison with Kant’s mature project, in which the meaning of <existence> is indeed explicated by recourse to a faculty, namely, our ability to use the assertoric function.[3] From SEC*, by contrast, we can conclude merely that we have the ability to carry out the relevant second-level predications. Neither that ability nor SEC* itself somehow determines the meaning of <instantiated>. I would suggest that rather than relying on this matter—a concept whose meaning is simply given, so far as SEC* is concerned—to account for the subject-object relationality of existential judgments, OPA locates it in their form. The materials for this move are to be found in his notion of absolute positing, which on a robust reading of POS differs in its form from any relative positing (of whatever level). Arguably, making this shift would actually justify a close relative of Abaci’s first thesis: we first understand the meaning of <existence> (which can subsequently be used predicatively) by virtue of our possession of the capacity to posit a single concept absolutely. It would also yield one component of Abaci’s second thesis, since in positing absolutely we claim that an object corresponds to, and is thus distinct from, the concept posited.[4] To be clear, in the current literature there is nothing atypical about Abaci’s interpretation of POS such that it reduces to SEC*. Yet if one takes relationality to be the key to Kant’s mature account, and if one takes Kant to have already taken a key step toward that revolution in 1763, then a more robust reading of POS is a promising place to look.

A crucial question that Chapter 3 leaves open is what its uncompromising espousal of the Negative Thesis really amounts to. The reader might wonder, as she encounters the insistence that existence is not the property of any object (possible or actual), what prevents us from thinking the first-order, singular thought “a is actual” (using “actual” to mark that it is a different concept from the second-order concept)? Is it not at least within our power to form the concept of a first-order property that belongs to an object a if and only if the concept of one of a’s properties is instantiated? Kant’s own language in OPA suggests an affirmative answer,[5] and it is hard to see how he could resist. Once we have disambiguated our discourse and made clear that <existence> and the first-order <actuality> are different concepts, though, everyone should agree that the former is not the property of any object!

In response, Abaci’s Kant could insist that the second-order property is metaphysically basic. But this doesn’t seem to be among his concerns in OPA, and in any case it does nothing to help him defeat the ontological argument. This is part of the reason that Stang, who agrees with Abaci in attributing SEC* to Kant, holds that the universality of actuality—in other words, that there are no merely possible objects—is doing the real argumentative work for Kant.[6] Abaci insists on Kant’s behalf that “no first-order predicate can entail anything about existence, because existence is a second-order predicate” (101). Yet neither Kant (nor, consequently, Abaci) tells us specifically why a concept’s being second-order makes all such inferences invalid. Now, it might be that this is merely a lacuna in Kant’s case, but this silence stands in notable contrast to Kant’s evident concern to convince us that a relative positing is the mere assertion of a conditioning relation between two possible positings, which as such posits neither the concepts that are being related. Ch. 8 gives a sympathetic reconstruction of an objection to the ontological argument in the first Critique that is plainly built upon just this point, but Abaci treats it as an anomaly within Kant’s corpus (231–33). I suggest that this is the key to Kant’s argument already in 1763.

Space requires that I leave nearly all of the riches in Ch. 4’s intricate treatment of the Actualist Principle untouched, save for situating it within the larger drama of Kant’s development. The pre-critical Kant is revisionist but not revolutionary in large part, according to Abaci, because he merely flirts with grounding the Actualist Principle in our cognitive make-up. What Kant needs if his own proof is to supplant the ontological argument is for the Actualist Principle to capture a truth about things in themselves, to use later terminology. The suggestive opening chapter of Part III (Ch. 5) documents that soon after OPA Kant begins toying with subjective groundings for the principle. Chapter 8 completes the story with a helpful reading of the fully relativized 1781-version of the positive proof that appears in the first Critique’s Transcendental Ideal. Abaci puts pressure on Kant’s 1763 position by noting the absence of any free-standing argument for the Actualist Principle in its robust, ontological guise. The transcendental turn buoys Kant’s prospects for justifying what is by then a weakened principle.

The core of Part III is devoted to Kant’s mature, positive theory as it is found within his account of the functions of judgment (Ch. 6), categories, schemata, and principles (all three in Ch. 7). Any reasonably complete reconstruction of Kant’s theory will need to address modality as it appears at each of these “levels.” Abaci, in a move that is characteristic of the book’s ambition, takes up the challenge. The book’s treatment of the modal categories and schemata is to my mind, however, hampered by the assumption that the former apart from the latter “signify logical relations,” in particular the logical relations of compatibility, connection, and connection through a law (170). I don’t see how this can be right. All are well-advised to join Abaci in holding that modal properties are not intrinsic properties of things in themselves (see the rich Ch. 9). Yet that leaves open the possibility that they are relational properties whose relata are subjects and objects. Abaci, by contrast, takes the senses of the bare modal categories to be varieties of intra-subjective relation. Now, there is an important, sometimes neglected truth in the neighborhood that might be pushing Abaci toward this position: anything that exists, for Kant, belongs to a manifold of reciprocally connected existents, which are connected by laws. Yet these connections are ontic, not logical.

Let’s focus, in closing, on the book’s treatment of the modal functions of judgment, whose importance Abaci correctly gauges. Here he explicitly proposes a synthesis of two different model-types that interpreters have traditionally espoused in their unadulterated forms (6, 146). One model understands the modal functions in terms of intra-subjective relations:

The modality of a given judgment is determined by how it coheres with a background, i.e., whether it is merely logically compatible with it [problematic], or it is logically grounded in the background [assertoric], or it is so grounded in virtue of laws of formal logic [apodictic]. Modal functions are then what logically connect judgments in a coherent system of judgments. (164)

The central idea of the alternative pure model is that a subject who uses the assertoric function relates a propositional content that she has in view to objects by claiming that it corresponds to how things are.[7] The way in which Abaci combines these two models is quite complicated, and it leaves some important features of the proposed synthesis murky. One particular area of difficulty is whether his account leaves any room for the straightforward idea that what the assertoric function enables us to do is to commit ourselves to the correspondence truth of some content. Consider this formulation: “in problematic judging, we merely entertain or think the proposition with respect to its relative logical possibility without making any assertion. . . . In assertoric judging we assert the judgment (as logically grounded) through the power of judgment” (162). The parenthetical addition in the final sentence makes Abaci’s precise view unclear. If I simply assert p, have I thereby used the assertoric function? Or do I need instead to assert that p is logically grounded in order to make use of the function (which falls short of asserting p itself)? Or do I need to assert both p and its logical groundedness? It might not be an accident that this aspect of the interpretation remains less than fully worked out. After all, any attempt to combine the two pure models faces a challenge: how can we do justice to the insights of both? The third option meets this challenge, but does so, disappointingly, through simple conjunction. Shouldn’t its proponent recognize that each of those conjuncts is itself a more fundamental function, especially since there is no barrier to one being used independently of the other? As this illustrates, once one has set oneself the challenge of reconciling the two model-types, it is not easy to see how to meet it in a substantively satisfactory way.

However, this assumes that each of the three modal functions is a single thing, and one of Abaci’s background commitments in effect calls this into question. Abaci suggests, namely, that though the functions of judgment “originally belong” to pure, general logic (PGL), they likewise belong to transcendental logic (TL) (163). Whereas the modal functions as they figure in, or are interpreted by, PGL concern “formal truth” (logical relations between propositions), the TL-versions of the functions concern “material truth” (160–63). This opens up a new strategy for meeting the challenge: while the modal functions in their PGL-guise are different types of intra-subjective relationality, their TL-versions are built around (or at least do justice to) subject-object relationality. Abaci’s use of the distinction includes a surprising twist:

while at the general logical level the copula ‘is’ expresses only the conceptual relation between the subject and the predicate, at the transcendental logical level it expresses that this conceptual relation is indeed connected to the materially determined whole of cognition, which, in turn, means that the conceptual relation actually holds in reality, i.e., it is materially true. (164)

Assuming a coherence conception of truth, perhaps intra-subjective relationality, at its limit (“the whole of cognition”), is a subject-object relation. In sum, though Abaci sets out to retain some of what models featuring subject-object relationality have to offer, it is not clear that any of that pole remains in the end.

One source of pressure to make intra-subjective relationality primary is that Kant often uses the terms “problematic,” assertoric,” and “apodictic” in ways that fit that model. I would argue, though, that it is the functions of judgment that play the central, weight-bearing role within Kant’s mature program, and that many uses of those terms occur in contexts in which Kant is not making claims about the functions.[8] If we treat passages in which Kant is using these terms more loosely as if they were making claims about the functions, we risk syncretism. However much this applies in the present case, a source of pressure that is definitely pushing Abaci toward intra-subjective relationality is his assumption—a natural enough assumption, with a storied history in the secondary literature—that Kant’s systematic account of the functions in the Metaphysical Deduction must belong to PGL. I have argued elsewhere that this is a mistake. Kant recognizes that we need to view judgments as cognitions of objects if we are to arrive at an accurate theory of the functions. The perspective of PGL, which treats thoughts merely in their relation to other thoughts, is simply not enough.[9]

What, then, might be an alternative for those who remain unconvinced by Abaci’s proposed synthesis and yet recognize that intra-subjective relationality has some role to play? Broadly, my suggestion is that we distinguish between what the functions enable us to do and the normative standards that pertain to those actions. Kant might, for instance, hold that what the assertoric function enables a subject to do is simply to assert p (understood in terms of correspondence truth), though we ought to do this under conditions that can only be explicated in terms that make reference to intra-subjective relationality. This is obviously a general pattern, which could be filled out in many different ways, with varying rationales for the normative standard. And a full account, if successful, could present the remaining two modalities as building upon the primary case of the assertoric function and existence, perhaps through the introduction of further intra-subjective relations.

Let me emphasize in closing that this is an unusually rich book, filled with many proposals that need to be considered. Anyone who is working on the issues that it directly addresses will profit from spending time with it. And because of the centrality of modality to Kant’s overall project, many in the wider Kant community will be glad if they make the time to consult it.


Rosenkoetter, Timothy (2010), “Absolute positing, the Frege Anticipation thesis, and Kant’s definitions of judgment,” European Journal of Philosophy, vol. 18.4: 539–566.

Rosenkoetter, Timothy (2017), “The Logical Home of Kant’s Table of Functions,” Internationales Jahrbuch des Deutschen Idealismus, vol. 12: 29–52.

Stang, Nicholas (2016), Kant’s Modal Metaphysics, Oxford University Press.

[1] The difficulty in parsing the just-quoted passage hints at this. Is the relation in question between the cognitive subject and the representing of things or between the cognitive subject and the things, of which we possess representations? If I have understood him, Abaci’s answer is “both.”

[2] There is textual evidence for each of these alternatives (OPA, 2:72 and 2:74 for the first; 2:72–3 for the second) that rivals the textual evidence for SEP* (2:72). The popularity of the SEP* over competing specifications of SEP is due largely to its substantive philosophical advantages.

[3] This would need to be argued. However, Kant plausibly presents the functions as explanatorily prior, and thus as not merely containing, or being identical to, the categories.

[4] I develop this model in Rosenkoetter (2010), arguing further that Kant explains relative positings in part by appeal to the simpler notion of absolute positing. To judge <God is omnipotent> is to judge that if God is posited absolutely, then omnipotence is posited absolutely. Notice that this reverses the order of explanation in Abaci’s account, which takes the intelligibility of relative positing as basic and adds the concept <instantiated>.

[5] I have in mind passages in which Kant is giving a favored paraphrase, rather than reporting on common usage, and yet seems unconcerned about using a first-order concept. For instance: “existence belongs to the narwhal. . . . This simply means: the representation of a narwhal is an empirical concept; in other words, it is the representation of an existent thing [eines existierenden Dinges]” (OPA, 2:72, italics added; cf. Rosefeldt 2011).

[6] Cf. Stang 2016: 31–42. Abaci, for his part, agrees with Stang on the universality of actuality. SEC* provides a formidable reason to deny that there are mere possibilia. If there were, then a further concept beyond <instantiated> would be required to distinguish actual from merely possible objects.

[7] This is a good place to acknowledge that the assertoric function and existence, on which I will focus here, are the most straightforward pair for a subject-object relationalist. Kant does not, for instance, allow for possibilia that could figure similarly in an account of problematicity and possibility.

[8] I had some difficulty understanding the book’s proposal for how, precisely, the functions relate to the categories (cf. 167). It might be that Abaci is not committed to the explanatory priority of the functions. Without the latter, though, it isn’t clear why the functions are particularly important to Kant’s modal theory.

[9] Cf. Rosenkoetter (2017). For present purposes, my reading is not importantly different from holding that the Table of Functions belongs to TL. In fact, I argue for a slightly different position that can explain why there is some textual evidence pointing toward the Table’s belonging to PGL.