Kant's Theory of Normativity,

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Konstantin Pollok, Kant's Theory of Normativity, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 350pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107127807.

Reviewed by Yoon H. Choi, Marquette University


Konstantin Pollok begins by drawing attention to the radical nature of Kant's Copernican turn. We miss its full significance, he argues, if we cast it as a demure retreat from ontology to epistemology (14, 25). Kant effects something far bolder: the final displacement of divine perfection from its traditional role as "ultimate and unique source of normativity" (23). But what comes next? Does it remain true that there are ways we ought to think and act, perhaps even feel? Where could such standards come from, and what could give them their authority? Kant's answer to these questions is familiar enough: reason and reason alone is to be our guide. But it remains far from clear what this answer means, and if it has been taken to be singularly profound, it has also been taken to be vacuous.

In Kant's Theory, Pollok offers an original and richly elaborated interpretation of Kant's solution. He argues that Kant's theory of normativity is entwined with his groundbreaking recognition of the normative primacy of judgment. This confers corresponding primacy on the norms of judgment. And according to Pollok, the norms of judgment turn out to be none other than the synthetic a priori principles that are also constitutive of judgment. These synthetic a priori principles thus take on the status of "fundamental norms." In his own words, Pollok's basic thesis asserts that "Synthetic a priori principles represent the structure of the 'space of reason.' They are the core of Kant's theory of normativity" (1). This thesis might sound a bit anodyne, but the theory that emerges is thoroughly provocative and intriguing. To bring it into view, I first set out the central line of Pollok's argument, following his order of exposition. I then try to delineate the basic features of the theory of normativity that emerges, and discover a few questions as I go.

Part one is devoted to an analysis of Kant's theory of judgment. Chapter one highlights the normative implications of Kant's tradition-breaking claim that judgments take normative primacy. Concepts alone are useless. We can't do anything with them, let alone do anything well or poorly with them. Judgments are the most elementary units of normative significance (56). They are also, as Pollok argues in chapter two, essentially normative. Drawing on the Critique of Pure Reason, Pollok offers an interpretation of Kant's claim that judgment is generated in a synthesis that is self-conscious and spontaneous and thus draws accountability with it.

Having highlighted the special normative status of judgment, Pollok sets out to compile and categorize the varieties of judgment. For if there are distinct and irreducible kinds of judgment, there may very well be distinct and irreducible norms of judgment. This taxonomic task, with which part one ends, turns out to be far from trivial. Pollok combines a systematic analysis of the faculties of the judging subject with a systematic analysis of possible objects of judgment; layers in "analytic" divisions of the "material" of judgment (analytic/synthetic, a priori/a posteriori, etc.) as well as "syllogistic tripartitions" of the forms of judgment (from the table of judgment), and finds some ingenious ways to argue for the systematic significance of the correlations that emerge (see especially the discussion of the modalities, 68-72). The astonishing variety and complexity of this taxonomy fortunately resolves to reveal three distinct domains of rational activity: theoretical, practical, and aesthetic. Though we make any number of different kinds of judgment as we engage in these activities, each domain has a signature kind of judgment that it issues and a signature set of principles it operates with. Thus theoretical reasoning employs synthetic a priori principles of understanding to issue judgments of experience; moral deliberation employs the categorical imperative to issue moral maxims; and aesthetic judgment employs the principle of purposiveness to issue judgments of taste. These principles articulate forms of valid judgment. The synthetic a priori principles of understanding articulate the form that a judgment must have if it is to be a valid judgment of experience; the categorical imperative articulates the form a maxim must have if it is to be a valid, i.e., moral, maxim; and so on.

In part two, Pollok draws out the hylomorphic account that underwrites Kant's talk of form. Chapter four sets out a general framework for understanding how synthetic a priori principles can be both constitutive of, and normative for, judgment. Chapter five situates the forms of judgment in a hierarchy of forms, outlining the process by which the matter given to thought is progressively determined, yielding not only judgments but also arguments, theories, a unified system of nature, and indeed an ethicotheology that draws together the systems of nature and freedom. I return to these chapters later, but pause to draw attention to a few remarks that I'm not quite sure what to make of. Pollok characterizes Kant's matter-form distinction as a "methodological dualism" (198, my emphasis), an "analytic tool for describing the possibility of claims about the 'is' and the 'ought' of objects in the broadest sense of anything we can think about" (118, my emphasis; also 16). This language strikes me as incongruously deflationary. After all, doesn't Kant's hylomorphism tell us how we make meaningful and valid claims about things by telling us what meaningful and valid claims must be about?

However that question is answered, we are left with the recognition that the synthetic a priori principles constitute, with complete pervasiveness, all of our conscious thought. And part three asks, with newfound urgency, what makes these judgments normative for judgment? According to Pollok, the synthetic a priori principles of theoretical, practical, and aesthetic judgment articulate the "point of view that rational and finite beings like us must assume in order to judge" (18; also 198 and 219). That is, they are "laws of reason"; it is only in following them that I inhabit the "point of view" from which judgment and rational activity is possible. Pollok is emphatic about how "reason" is to be understood here. He writes that "reason is neither identical with nor reducible to the individual mind of this or that person, you or me" (200; also 61, 204, 210, 264). Accordingly, its laws are not to be understood as resulting from the choice or deliberation of any empirical individual. There remains, however, a role for "you and [me], and every other finite, rational being": I must "implicitly or explicitly, but in any case imputably, acknowledge the a priori laws" for them to become normative for me, and you must do the same for yourself (210-1). As Pollok puts it, the "transcendental forms of cognition gain normative traction through the acknowledgement by empirical subjects" (185; also 199).

With the general structure of normativity thus outlined, Pollok proceeds to show how it is fleshed out in each of the three domains of rational activity. Thus his last three chapters take up each of the Critiques in turn, detailing how the synthetic a priori principles of understanding, the categorical imperative, and the principle of purposiveness are constitutive of and normative for our theoretical, moral-practical, and aesthetic pursuits, respectively. Pollok thus embeds his analysis deep within the whole range of Kant's Critical concerns and commitments, and the picture that emerges is tremendously rich, dense with detail and sprawling in scope. We are offered many a thought-provoking interpretive proposal in passing, as Pollok touches on everything from the nature of provisional judgments and judgments of perception to the role of conscience. But it is not easy to know how to engage substantively and fairly with these discussions. For instance, Pollok argues that "transcendental apperception" is a "standpoint," an "impersonal logical viewpoint" that "we necessarily project ourselves into" when we make judgments (64; also 14, 61-64 and 220-21). He uses similar language to characterize the "transcendental subject" (13, 220) and the "original-synthetic unity of apperception" (63, 64), thus identifying these concepts. These are highly controversial claims, but Pollok doesn't pause to mount a full defense of them. I take it that Pollok intends for his interpretations of specific doctrines to gain their plausibility from the way they all fit together to give a compelling account of the Critical philosophy as a whole. That is fair enough, given the scale of the theory he aims to spell out, except that he is also uncompromisingly committed to comprehensiveness. It becomes very hard to see how all the pieces fit together when there are so many pieces. I thus won't try to comment on the merits of Pollok's account as an interpretation of Kant. In the space remaining, I will try instead to bring out and engage with the core theory of normativity, disregarding exegetical constraints and shaking off whatever Kantian moorings get in the way.

I begin with the general arc of Pollok's argument. If I've understood him correctly, Pollok begins with a claim about the normative primacy of judgment and concludes with a claim about the normative primacy of forms of judgment. But the latter doesn't follow directly from the former -- at least not obviously. What gives judgment its special status is that it is the level of determination that first renders matter "normatively visible" (16). But just as the categorial forms are not logically independent of the forms of judgment, the forms of judgment are not logically independent of the forms of inference. Why, then, do the forms of judgment turn out to be normatively fundamental, rather than, say, the forms of inference or the form of systematic unity? My point is not that this question can't be answered, but that it has to be answered, and I'm not sure what Pollok's answer is.

This brings me to a question about how the claim that synthetic a priori principles are constitutive is to be understood. There are two ways such constitutivity claims get fleshed out. According to the first, it is impossible to engage in some activity without conforming to the principles that constitute the activity (e.g., Korsgaard 1997). According to the second, it is impossible to engage in some activity without being liable to assessment by the principles that constitute the activity (e.g., MacFarlane 2000). This is the route Pollok takes (e.g., 10, 138-9n48), but I find it difficult to reconcile with other elements of Pollok's account. Consider, again, the claim that it is judgment that first renders matter determinate enough that it is "normatively visible." It's easy to see how conformity to a principle could ensure normative visibility; perhaps by ensuring, for instance, propositional unity. It's harder to see how liability to assessment might account for such normative visibility.

I now turn to Pollok's "laws of reason" and ask what kind of law we're talking about -- and what kind of norm is thus generated. Pollok, as already noted, draws on MacFarlane's analysis of Kant's theory of logic. According to MacFarlane, when Kant says that the laws of logic are general, he means that they are constitutive of "thought as such." We cannot think without them; they are "necessary in a strong sense" (2000, 55). But importantly, these norms are also normative. In fact, the claim is that the laws of logic are, as normative, constitutive of thought as such; "it is impossible to think at all . . . without being constrained by them" (2000, 55). Though MacFarlane's analysis has been much debated (see, e.g., Tolley 2006 and Lu-Adler 2017), Pollok's main aim is to extend it. According to Pollok, "what MacFarlane maintains with respect to the normativity of general pure logic -- mutatis mutandis -- may be adapted to [the] 'special sciences,'" i.e., the specific domains of thought governed by the synthetic a priori principles (138). Is that right? Are Pollok's laws of reason constitutive of and normative for their respective domains in the same way that MacFarlane's laws of logic are constitutive of and normative for thinking in general? A potential difficulty is this: general laws are necessary laws, but specific laws are contingent laws, laws that are, as MacFarlane puts it, "only conditionally applicable" (2000, 52-53). And this matters if it turns out that the contingent laws can only generate hypothetical imperatives and not categorical imperatives. For no theory that leaves us with only hypothetical imperatives is an adequate interpretation of Kant's theory.

It might be helpful to see how this worry doesn't arise for MacFarlane -- or indeed for Pollok's main foil, Christine Korsgaard. There's no chance either ends up with hypothetical imperatives. Though MacFarlane is talking about the general laws of logic and Korsgaard is talking about the law of instrumental reasoning, both solder my very identity to the laws in question such that there is no room left -- no I left -- to challenge or deny their authority. On MacFarlane's view, I don't exist as a thinker unless the laws of logic are constraining my thinking. On Korsgaard's view, I don't exist as a will unless I am conforming to the law of instrumental reasoning. As she puts it, "There is no position from which you can reject the government of instrumental reason: for if you reject it, there is no you" (1997, 254).

Pollok does not take this route. He is, in fact, emphatic about introducing conceptual space between reason and its timeless laws, on the one hand, and empirical reasoners and their time-bound reasonings, on the other (see, e.g., 200). By introducing this conceptual space and assigning us empirical reasoners the task of acknowledgement, Pollok grants empirical selves a kind of independence from reason. Failing to acknowledge one or some of these laws of reason may leave me stunted in this or that way, but failing to acknowledge all of them seems to leave me there, an empirical self, able to acknowledge the laws of reason at any time but able also to dig in my heels and refuse to acknowledge them. What makes such an empirical self acknowledge the laws of reason? How is the picture to be completed from here? One might look for leverage among my current interests and commitments, but this route can only generate hypothetical imperatives. More problematically, if I haven't already acknowledged at least some of the laws of reason, there may be no way to reason me into accepting some others. Is there an alternative way to flesh out the picture? Perhaps Pollok can say that the laws of reason are constitutive of rationality and rationality just is something normative for me (251-63 suggests something like this). But if this is right, then what role is left for acknowledgement? It is unclear to me why Pollok insists on modelling the relation between reason and reasoners in this way (for some hints, see 210 and 200). The same structure emerges in his account of transcendental apperception and its relation to the empirical self. By turning the former into a "standpoint into which we as empirical selves must project ourselves in order to make a judgment" (61), Pollok leaves us having to make sense of the confusing possibility of an empirical self without transcendental apperception.

I must leave off here, though I haven't touched on more than a fraction of Kant's Theory of Normativity. Pollok's book deserves close engagement; it is, in my view, uncommonly demanding, but it is also uncommonly rich. And that just might be the mark of a successful interpretation of Kant's Critical philosophy.


Korsgaard, C. 1997. "The Normativity of Instrumental Reason." In Ethics and Practical Reason. Ed. G. Cullity and B. Gaut. Oxford University Press, 215-54.

Lu-Adler, H. 2017. "Kant and the Normativity of Logic." European Journal of Philosophy, doi: 10.1111/ejop.12242.

MacFarlane, J. 2000. "What Does it Mean to Say That Logic is Formal?" Ph.D. Dissertation, University of Pittsburgh.

Tolley, C. 2006. "Kant on the Nature of Logical Laws." Philosophical Topics 34: 371-407.