Karl Jaspers: Politics and Metaphysics

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Chris Thornhill, Karl Jaspers: Politics and Metaphysics, Routledge, 2002, 288pp, $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 0415269067

Reviewed by Alan Olson, Boston University


In this informative and highly readable study, Chris Thornhill makes a strong case for Karl Jaspers as one of the enduring, albeit under-appreciated, philosophical voices of the twentieth century. He does so for the following reasons:

Jaspers’s ideas and reflections have been appropriated and modified within a very wide range of philosophical and political debates…His reflections of revelation and secularity touch the heart of many central debates in theology, his transcendental concept of humanity raises questions of far-reaching importance for philosophical anthropology, his notion of communication as an experiential corrective to idealism is a crucial innovation in the development of models of inter-subjectivity, speech-hermeneutics and the theory of consciousness, his humanist-hermeneutical reconstruction of metaphysics presents an important position in the anti-metaphysical climate of modern philosophy, [and] his reading of Kant – and his resultant debate with Heidegger [and Lukács]…is one of the defining debates within modern political epistemology and political humanism (208).

A specialist in German and European Studies at King’s College (University of London), Thornhill demonstrates these claims convincingly by placing Jaspers within the German intellectual milieu of early and mid-20th century intellectual history and examining the philosophy of Jaspers vis-à-vis his principal sources and interlocutors: Kant, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Weber, Dilthey, Simmel, Heidegger, Barth, Bultmann, Tillich, Arendt, Lukács, Adorno and Habermas, among others. By so doing, Thornhill succeeds admirably by addressing a serious lacuna not only in the existing Jaspers scholarship but also the history of modern German philosophy.

In the first three chapters of his finely crafted work, Thornhill examines Jaspers in relation to his principal philosophical informants: Kant and Weber. In the next four chapters (especially the final chapter, very appropriately entitled Republican Existence), he moves on to a discussion of religion and politics. In these concluding chapters it becomes evident that the order of “politics and metaphysics” in the subtitle is not a mistake, even though the book commences with a study of metaphysics. For the key to understanding Jaspers (as in the case of so many thinkers during the tempestuous mid-twentieth century), Thornhill argues, is his political life.

Thornhill begins his study by noting how Jaspers, as the philosopher of transcendence, consistently uses this category as a verbal-noun or substantive. He designates this by the parenthetical adjective “transcendent(al)” which, in my view, is an excellent way to capture the split reference that is at once metaphysical and epistemological in this central Jaspersian existential category. As Thornhill indicates, Kantian antinomies are never to be viewed as the objects of negation or “overcoming,” as in Heidegger, but as the limits (grenzen) that make critical philosophizing possible. The price of negation, as Thornhill makes clear in his final chapters, is a cancellation of the Freiheits-Philosophie that is at the heart of the philosophy of Jaspers. This is why Thornhill characterizes the philosophy of Jaspers as antinomical in contrast to the work of his principal adversaries, Heidegger and Lukács, who would deconstruct Kant’s antinomies, whether from the right or the left.

While it is not always clear how the author is using his copious references, one soon becomes convinced Thornhill knows that whereof he speaks. Nevertheless, the inclusion of Georg Simmel (with Wilhelm Dilthey) in the chapter on “Experience and History” is a bit odd. There are parallels between Simmel and Jaspers, especially in the early work, Psychologie der Weltanschaungen (1919), but it is difficult to see any major intellectual debt to Simmel. Here Thornhill relies chiefly on a single article by Hanoch Tennen (1976), and admits that Jaspers makes no direct references or attributions to Simmel in his own work. In my view, the author also places a bit too much emphasis upon the importance of Lebensphilosopie in connecting Jaspers with Dilthey and Simmel. Jaspers’s indebtedness to Kant (“The nodal point in modern philosophy”) prevents him from identifying with the romantic side of the “philosophy of life” or vitalism of any sort. This obviously is also what separates Jaspers from Heidegger, as Tillich and others have argued. And it was the Neo-Romantics, as Thornhill notes, who fell in with the NSDAP in much greater numbers than the Neo-Kantians (many of whom were Jewish), as evidenced most notably in the controversial cases of Heidegger and Carl Schmitt. What Thornhill characterizes as Jaspers’s “existential rescue” of Kant from the Neo-Kantians, however, is definitely on the mark, and this is a truly unique and not well-understood chapter in the history of early 20th-century German philosophy.

Thornhill convincingly argues that there are two distinct phases in Jaspers’s work: the early work in anthropological metaphysics (existential interpretation of Kant by way of Max Weber); and the later work on ethical, political and social philosophy, where he cites the influence of Dilthey and Simmel. Here, and elsewhere, where Thornhill deals with the “democratic elitism” and “conservative liberalism” of Jaspers, he might profitably have referenced the work of Kurt Salamun (Graz), who has written extensively on the concept of liberality in Jaspers, Topish and Popper, and with whom Thornhill seems to be in basic agreement.

Thornhill’s discussion of Nietzsche, and especially Schelling, in relation to Jaspers, is minimal, as is his reference to Hegel in the final chapters. But Hegel, above all, is the shadow looming behind Jaspers (second only to Kant), especially as he attempts to formulate his logic in Von der Wahrheit. Clearly Jaspers is heavily influenced by Hegel’s Rechtsphilosophie, and this work, especially Hegel’s discussion of the cultural role of the aristocracy in a constitutional monarchy, can shed a great deal of light on Jaspers’s “conservative liberalism” and his Weberian “elite democracy.”

Thornhill’s treatment of Kierkegaard and Jaspers is also minimal, especially as it bears on the nature of “philosophical faith”, since the author fails to see the differential nuance between “belief” and “faith,” whether in English or in German, and their relation to “knowledge.” These terms are not quite the same, as Hegel argued famously, and Fritz Buri and Harold Oliver more recently. Belief in ordinary usage (especially in German) tends to be associated with feeling and intuition, that is, with uncritical knowledge; whereas belief, when understood in the sense of fides, has a ,highly differentiated usage both in Catholic and Lutheran scholasticism, viz., as notitia, assensus, and fiducia, or knowledge of the facts, assent or judgment, and trust in the veridicality of one’s judgment. This must be taken into account when making sense out of Jaspers’s notion of “philosophical faith,” especially as developed in Der philosophische Glaube angesichts der Offenbarung (1962), since this historical background is well known to Jaspers.

Thornhill’s treatment of Jaspers’s theory of ciphers, vis-à-vis Georg Hamann, could have been improved, I think, with additional attention to Cassirer and certainly to work of one of Jaspers’s most famous students, Paul Ricoeur, who greatly depends upon Jaspers in his early writings. In the same vein, Thornhill’s treatment of “secularization” and “historicism” (Schleiermacher and Gogarten) seems to be a bit off the mark as it bears upon his discussion of Bultmann and the demythologizing debate of the 1950s. Historicism has fundamentally to do with “explaining” the meaning of ancient texts/events within the social, cultural, and political conditioning factors of the “content” within which they are generated. Hence the “relativization” of truth claims by those who charge that the historicism (and the sociology of knowledge, which today is probably the advance case of negative historicism) is not concerned with the “truth” of revelation (real or alleged), but only with how and why it happened the way it did. But there are also romantic historicists who invoke psychology by “thinking” their way into the minds of the author in order ‘to understand the author better than the author understood himself,’ as in Romantic hermeneutics. This might be called “positive historicism” since the devotees of the “hermeneutics of sympathetic reenactment,” as in the case of the early Ricoeur, suggest that by this approach the “meaning” of the originating myths and assertions is freed from the false bondage of myth (Bultmann). Jaspers hovers between these two approaches, as Thornhill points out astutely, the upshot being that it is finally difficult to determine where Jaspers stands.

The ambiguity of Jaspers on this and other issues, Thornhill argues, may be best clarified by his politics. This is why the final three chapters of his study stand out as truly illuminating and, in my view, as a convincing interpretation of Jaspers. This is no mean feat, since the politics of the middle part of the 20th century, whether in religious or secular matters, were very murky indeed – especially in Germany. In his discussion of Jaspers and Karl Barth, for example, the author observes that while these two thinkers are diametrically opposed on matters of metaphysics (theology), they have much in common politically – not to be sure, the political program of Christian Socialism, but the shared conviction that Transcendence cannot be “objectified” in finite political and social institutions. The same applies to Jaspers’s relationship with Tillich who, while being much further “left” than Barth (given his Frankfurt background and the influence of Benjamin and Adorno) is very close to Jaspers on many philosophical and theological issues. What separates Jaspers from Tillich and, perhaps, most of his famous contemporaries, is Kantianism and a rigorous adherence to the “limit situations” intrinsic to “critical philosophy,” whereas Tillich and Bultmann espouse a far more determinate decisionism within the context of Christian theology and culture.

The final, altogether fascinating, chapter of Thornhill’s study is entitled “Republican Existence,” and it brilliantly captures the political sentiments of Karl Jaspers as a “cultural republican” and a “conservative liberal” inspired and guided by Plato and Kant. It is interesting to note, in this context, that Jaspers’s successor at Heidelberg, Hans-Georg Gadamer, was criticized by Habermas for precisely the same reasons. Jaspers’s republican convictions, so well-evidenced in his later political writings, are present from the beginning, as Thornhill points out, most notably in The Idea of the University, which goes through minor modifications in three editions (1923, 1946, 1961). Thornhill rightly identifies Jaspers’s university “Idea” as a cipher of Transcendence, that is, as a sign of mögliche Existenz, that can never be entirely realized or objectified – but should not, on those grounds, be rejected as illusory.

Thornhill’s discussion of the political Jaspers includes a brilliant analysis of Heidegger and Lukács in the form of a triadic dialectic whereby, as in the treatment of Hegel by Marx, “heaven is brought down to earth”. This analysis, by itself, makes Thornhill’s book worth reading, and it provides ample evidence that Jaspers may well be one of those “marginalized” thinkers who, like so many others in the 19th century, will be rediscovered by way of retrospective period studies devoted to the previous century. As Thornhill makes clear in his final chapter, a primary reason for the neglect of Jaspers during the late 20th century was that he was not “radical enough” to attract devotees from either the left or the right. As we now cautiously move into the 21st century, Chris Thornhill provides ample evidence as to why Karl Jaspers stands vindicated from the exigencies and enthusiasms of the moment, and why he deserves to be rediscovered and appropriated during a more stoical age.