Key Concepts in Chinese Philosophy

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Zhang, Dainian, Key Concepts in Chinese Philosophy, translated by Edmund Ryden, Yale University Press, 2002, 529pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0300092105.

Reviewed by Xinyan Jiang, University of Redlands


Zhang Dainian is one of the best-known scholars of Chinese philosophy working in China. Although it is understandable that many students of Chinese philosophy in the West have not heard about Zhang, it would be unthinkable if such a student in China had not read Zhang’s works. Key Concepts in Chinese Philosophy, like An Outline of Chinese Philosophy (Chinese Social Science Press, 1982), is among Zhang’s best writings on Chinese philosophy. Zhang belongs to the older generation of scholars, who are extremely well founded in classical Chinese language, literature, and history. A very good command of Chinese classics and a lifelong devotion to Chinese philosophy have made it possible for Zhang to produce a work that provides readers with comprehensive and systematic expositions of key concepts and categories in Chinese philosophy. Unlike many other recent books that discuss only a particular period or school, Zhang’s book covers important concepts in Chinese philosophy that run through pre-Qin to the Qing Dynasty.

Understanding the central concepts is the key to the study of Chinese philosophy. One of the greatest difficulties for Westerners who study and teach the subject, especially those who are trained in the analytic tradition, is that many concepts look ambiguous and are subject to various interpretations. A concept may have different meanings in different philosophers or in different periods. Those who are not familiar with the entire history of Chinese philosophy will find it hard to see the various meanings of those important terms. Zhang’s book performs an invaluable service by offering a brief but synthetic outline and history of a great number of key concepts and providing rich historical data for various interpretations. It is extremely helpful not only for scholars undertaking research in depth on Chinese philosophy but also for beginners struggling with the basics. This English version now extends these benefits to Western readers. Edmund Ryden should be thanked and congratulated for introducing such a significant and excellent work as Zhang’s to the English-speaking world.

As rearranged by its translator, Zhang’s book is divided into three parts: Metaphysics, Anthropology, and Epistemology. Under the heading of Metaphysics, there are Ontology and Cosmology. Ontology includes Principal Concepts and Apophatic Terms. Cosmology includes Yin-yang, Concepts of Growth, Concepts Derived from Daoism, Concepts Derived from the Book of Changes, and Concepts of Relation. The part on Anthropology covers Moral Philosophy and Psychology. Moral philosophy includes Moral Ideals and Ethical Concepts, while psychology includes Human Nature and Concepts of Intentionality. Epistemology includes Theory of Knowledge, Philosophy of Language, and Theory of Truth. All told, the book has 64 sections, each introducing one or two concepts that frequently occur in Chinese philosophy. There is also a brief introductory paragraph to each section by the translator. For the most part, the treatments of particular concepts are very detailed and comprehensive, sometimes running fifteen pages. The translator’s brief introductory paragraph provides readers with a good guide to the section that follows.

Key Concepts in Chinese Philosophy might serve as an encyclopedia of concepts in Chinese philosophy. It is very rich in data. There are many well-selected quotations in each section to back up the interpretations. Zhang’s interpretations and organization of data clearly demonstrate that he is one of the best historians of Chinese philosophy.

The first two sections of the book well illustrate Zhang’s approach. The first concept he explains is tian (Heaven), one of the most important and most difficult concepts in Chinese philosophy. Zhang starts with the original meaning of “tian” and then brings readers to its later philosophical meanings and interpretations. An extremely wide range of views on Heaven is discussed, including ideas from Confucius, Zhuangzi, Mozi, Mencius, Guanzi, Xunzi, Dong Zhongshu, Wang Chong, Zhang Zai, Cheng Hao, Cheng Yi, Liu Zongyuan, Liu Yuxi, Wang Shouren, and the Sayings of States. This book will be a tremendous help for all who find it difficult to grasp and explain various meanings of Heaven in Chinese philosophy but do not have enough time or resources to do a comprehensive investigation of the concept.

Zhang’s second section, on Tao or the Way, is helpful in a similar manner. The section is divided into the following sub-sections: the Spring and Autumn Period (which focuses on the Zuo Commentary and Confucius), the Laozi and Zhuangzi, the Great Appendix to the Book of Changes, the Guanzi, the Xunzi, the Hanfeizi, the Song Era (which focuses on Zhang Zai, Cheng Hao, Cheng Yi, and Zhu Xi), the Qing Era (which focuses on Wang Fuzhi and Yan Yuan), and Conclusion. Zhang’s survey of the concept provides readers with both a very useful outline of the meanings of Tao in Chinese philosophy and directions for research on it in depth. After offering its readers a complex and multifaceted picture of the concept of Tao, the section ends with a very short but extremely helpful summary of the four levels of meanings of the concept of Tao.

An excellent feature of the book is that its introduction to each concept not only provides various perspectives and interpretations but also presents them in a historical order. For example, the section on qi (commonly translated as “vital energy”) starts from the pre-Qin period and ends with the Ming-Qing era. At the end of each introduction to a period, there is also a very brief summary of the understanding of the concept during the period. By explaining how the concept of qi was understood by various philosophers in different periods and how it evolved in history, Zhang offers his readers a comprehensive account of its meanings. Other key concepts, such as yin-yang, principle, and human nature, are explained in a similar way.

Another merit of the book is that it does well at helping its readers find connections between related concepts. For example, it provides useful hints to see how the concepts of qi, yin-yang, five agents, and thing or object, are interrelated. According to Zhang, although qi is the most basic substance from which all things are made, it is not inert but active, in constant motion. That makes qi differ from ordinary “matter.” Yin and yang are basic forms of qi and give directions to qi’s change. The five agents are basic elements that are likewise made of qi; they are particular forms of yin and yang and particular kinds of qi. They are the lowest level of stuff, but they too are not inactive but rather dynamic agents. All objects or things are made of the five elements. An overall view of Chinese cosmology is as follows: cosmos starts with original qi, followed by yin and yang qi; from these, the five agents come to exist; and from the five agents or elements, myriad things are produced.

Like any book, this one is not perfect. For one thing, it provides little information about Chinese Buddhism, since Zhang’s interest is mainly in autochthonous Chinese philosophical concepts. When he does talk about Buddhist ideas, his discussion is not very detailed or comprehensive. For example, in his discussion of the concept of change, Zhang mentions only the Buddhist view that denies the reality of change but does not mention other Buddhist positions on the issue.

Furthermore, although, overall, Edmund Ryden has done excellent job in translating Zhang’s book, some of his translations are problematic or inaccurate. For example, “Anthropology” as the title of the second part of the book does not seem to be a precise translation of the original title “rensheng zherxue”, which means “philosophy of life.” The translation of the term yi also seems problematic. First, translating yi as “justice” in the section title “Ren-yi” does not reflect the true meaning of the concept in Chinese philosophy as precisely as “righteousness” or “rightness” does. Yi in general stands for moral norms or what is right. A person of yi is a person of virtues or integrity. Therefore, it means more than justice. Second, in his brief introduction to yi at the beginning of Zhang’s section on ren-yi, Ryden says: “Yi, what is right, is applied particularly to a person in authority, the father or the prince. It implies the correct use of authority according to moral norms” (p. 286). This understands yi as a concept even narrower than justice, an interpretation that seems not to be supported by the text of Zhang that follows. Third, translating yi in Mencius as “respect” is also problematic. Although Mencius regarded “jingzhang “ (respect the elder) as a manifestation of yi and used jingzhang to illustrate yi, he did not make yi the equivalent of respect. Yi implies respect but covers much more. According to Mencius, the feeling of shame and dislike is the beginning of yi, since it prevents people from doing what is shameful and disgusting or makes them feel ashamed or disgusted if they do wrong. It was Mencius who said that one should give up life and choose yi if one cannot have both of them (Mencius 6A: 10). Clearly, yi in Mencius is more than respect; it is righteousness and moral norms. Obviously, some improvement in the translation of this book might be made.

In spite of these imperfections, Key Concepts in Chinese Philosophy is still one of best books on Chinese philosophy. Its English version is an important contribution to Chinese philosophy studies in the West. I strongly recommend it to everyone who is interested in Chinese philosophy.