Kierkegaard and Death

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Patrick Stokes and Adam J. Buben (eds.), Kierkegaard and Death, Indiana University Press, 2011, 315pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780253223524.

Reviewed by Rick Anthony Furtak, Colorado College


The very topic of death is viewed by some philosophers as nothing but a gloomy preoccupation, quite peripheral to other concerns and perhaps best avoided altogether. One frequently cited claim in Part IV of Spinoza's Ethics is that a person who is intellectually liberated will almost never think about death, since wisdom consists in meditating not on death but on life. And yet, reflection on death is often justified in precisely those terms: namely, that it can somehow enable us to better understand our life as finite beings. Pierre Hadot makes this point by saying that the references to death in Stoicism are not evidence of any morbid obsession. He refers to "the film Dead Poets Society," when the character played by Robin Williams asks his students to study the old class photographs, in order to invigorate them to approach their own lives with a sense of urgency about realizing their highest potential. "It is with this goal in mind" that he reminds them that the boys pictured are long since dead.[1] Stokes and Buben state in their Introduction that Kierkegaard's writings take a similar approach to the topic: "the question death presents to us existentially is a thoroughly 'this-worldly' one," since it is "concerned with how we comport ourselves now to the fact of our own finitude" (16). And one theme that runs throughout this impressive volume is that, for a variety of reasons, the thought of death is intimately related to the task of living well.

For instance, in the 1845 discourse "At a Graveside," after dismissing as a "jest" the argument made by Epicurus that death is "nothing to us" due to the fact that we will not experience our own non-being, Kierkegaard "does not reject this argument by appealing to Christian teachings" about personal immortality, but instead "he seeks to present death as an existential problem for the living," meeting Epicurus on his own terms (258). His meditation on death in this discourse, as Edward Mooney points out, is unlike the classical ideal of philosophy as preparation for death; rather, it is directed toward the "intensification of life" (134). Other chapters also comment on how one's own mortality is portrayed in this discourse, as bringing about "earnestness" and giving "force" to life.[2] Now, why should the contemplation of death have this effect? Stokes appeals to the notion of "contemporaneity," a Kierkegaardian term he has explained persuasively in other work, to explain how one aim of "At a Graveside" is to bring the reader imaginatively into a state of proximity with his dead self: thus, "in earnest contemplation of my death, I apprehend my future death as presenting me with tasks here in the present" (263). This is consistent with the language of Kierkegaard's discourse, which claims that such contemplation allows one to perceive "a scarcity of time" that frees one from "vain pursuits," thus giving "the earnest person the right momentum in life," and "the right goal" toward which that momentum is oriented. In other words, as John Davenport claims in his contribution, the idea of our own death awakens "the voice of conscience," as Kierkegaard calls it in his 1847 discourse on "Purity of Heart," by instilling in us an awareness that our temporal finitude must figure into the "overall meaning" of our life, as it will have been attained once we have died and "our character is forever fixed." At this point, as Kierkegaard says, "the meaning" of our life "is at an end," and we will have beenwhatever we have become (170-171, 175). This anticipated retrospective vantage point offers a criterion for deciding which wholehearted commitments are worthy of being maintained in light of the question, what is the ultimate significance of my life as a whole?

Although that perspective is, in a crucial sense, unavailable to us (as Davenport notes), this does not prevent us from believing that it matters how our life would appear from a "final" point of view, in the future perfect tense or in the eyes of God. The recognition of our finitude thus moves us to reflect upon our entire life, and the ideals and values by which it is defined, in a way that bears a close resemblance to Heidegger's account of "being-toward-death" and "anticipatory resoluteness" (see 150, 160, 194-195), although some of the terms used by Kierkegaard are absent from Being and Time. This parallel is noted by Gordon Marino and explored by Charles Guignon, and it serves as a central theme for Davenport as well: all in all, one of the most distinct virtues of Kierkegaard and Death is its sustained examination of the ways in which what have come to be known as Heideggerian themes (especially themes from the first half of Division Two in Being and Time) are present in Kierkegaard's writings. The shared conceptual terrain is more than enough to warrant the conclusion that anyone interested in either thinker's account of death ought to take an interest in both.

Both Guignon and Davenport, in the two most Heideggerian chapters of this edited volume, refer to the notion of "resignation," and the related idea of a "double movement" that is developed in Fear and Trembling, to clarify an aspect of how a person may think about death, and about the meaning of life. When she reflects on how everything most precious to her is eventually "lost," although "not yet," this allows her to embrace the finite with a renewed sense of earnestness and urgency, since it is only within this delimited horizon that she can strive to lead a life that is authentically her own (175-176, 190). This suggestion is perfectly in keeping with the mention, in the relevant discourse of Kierkegaard's, of how one who accepts that everything in life is lost will be able to "win everything" again, just as the knight of faith renews a relation to finitude after having surrendered everything.[3] Since the fact of our mortality, our thrownness, and our "tendency to care about" our being-in-the-world are (as Guignon shows) acknowledged by Kierkegaard as well as by Heidegger, in such a way that an earnest confrontation with death makes "what is at issue" in our "life as a whole" come to light for Kierkegaard no less than Heidegger, it is unfortunate that Guignon ends his essay with a surprising endorsement of the dubious claim that there is nothing like an "ontology" in Kierkegaard's work (187-189, 200). He phrases this in terms that portray Kierkegaard in a positive light, by referring rather contemptuously to the ambition of offering a "grand systematic account" of the general structure of human existence, as if Guignon advises a scornful dismissal of "such grandiose projects" (201). Yet this may have the effect of doing an injustice to Heidegger's project and also to Kierkegaard's. After all, although Kierkegaard's treatment of mortality is meant to pertain to each human being quite personally, this is partly because of its relevance to all mortal human beings as such.

The highly general nature of the language used in the Kierkegaardian writings on death -- both in the discourses and in a pseudonymous work such as the Concluding Unscientific Postscript -- that is, discovering one's "ethical task," or seeking "a purpose for the whole of life," in the face of death -- shows their broadly human pertinence. Just as Heidegger does not designate what it is that the call of conscience will summon us toward, Kierkegaard and his pseudonyms also focus on the kind of reflection that is inspired by the idea of one's mortality. Exactly what vain pursuits should one be moved to abandon, and what specifically would qualify as a worthy undertaking, in the light of last things? Kierkegaard's reply may be inevitably abstract, if it amounts to something like this: we must determine what seems worthy or unworthy of our devotion when we contemplate the direction of our entire finite life, and then orient ourselves accordingly.

In each particular case, what we resolve to do with our limited time can be specified in a concrete "ontic" description, yet the account of how we form a conception of our life's meaning cannot spell out a definite answer, suitable for any and every reader. What might seem to be a frustrating level of generality, then, could actually be based on an author's sense of what form is appropriate for an account that applies to every human life. For instance, what it means to understand oneself in existence, the goal of any "subjective thinker" according to the Postscript, includes reflection on the type of existential questions that always concern us and are never settled once and for all, including what it means to be a mortal being. In his chapter of Kierkegaard and Death, David Possen argues that the vague, abstract way this question is raised by "Johannes Climacus" is not a lamentable omission. On the contrary, it is the result of an apt decision on Kierkegaard's part, to instill in the reader a state of "concerned ignorance" which is appropriate for issues that are humanly inescapable yet uncertain (124-126). The "difficulty" in thinking about death as it affects one's own life, as Paul Muench suggests, involves becoming and remaining aware of the emphatically "first-personal" way in which we are constantly working out a relation to our uncertain, finite existence, and facing the ethical task of becoming who we are (110-116). In portraying the importance of "thinking death into every moment," Climacus therefore answers his own demand for "a manner of doing philosophy" that pays attention to the existing individual in search of wisdom (101-102), and provokes her to attend to the meaning of her own existence rather than being distracted from this topic.

The sheer difficulty of actually thinking that I will die one day is what prevents Tolstoy's "Ivan Ilych," a character who is brought up repeatedly here (by George Connell, and by Mooney and Marino), from being able to register the implications of the conclusion that follows from the conjunction of all men are mortal and I am a man. The contributions by Mooney and Muench do an especially good job of explaining how the philosophical and literary project of Kierkegaard's diverse writings is motivated by the need to "bring home" such philosophical issues in an intimate way. He takes up the challenge of trying to write about the very fact that we can talk, or write, or read, about our own mortality without truly reflecting on what this means: the result may sound at times more like Heidegger and at other times more like Tolstoy, but this is perhaps a deliberate strategy, since the combination of these modes achieves more than either one could in isolation. The abstract voice and the personal one also appear in The Sickness unto Death and Works of Love, respectively, two other Kierkegaardian texts that address human finitude. While Connell and Simon Podmore develop the metaphorical notion of despair as a "living death" distinguished by the "absence of God" or the failure to become oneself (27, 49), Stokes and Jeremy Allen interpret the significance of remembering those whom we have loved, and who have passed away. Remembering is significant not only "for the sake of the living," whom we thereby learn to love unselfishly, but also as a duty that is quite literally on behalf of those who have died (see 234, 255). These chapters shed further light on the topic of human finitude, in relation to one of Kierkegaard's most difficult texts in the case of The Sickness unto Death and one of his most often misinterpreted inWorks of Love.

In sum, Kierkegaard and Death succeeds admirably at demonstrating how the Kierkegaardian corpus presents us with something like a philosophy of finite existence, in a way that will open up avenues of further research and should also serve as essential reading for anyone who believes that reflecting on human mortality could perhaps be a fruitful enterprise after all. If I have said little or nothing about some chapters, this is only for the sake of delving further into certain parts of a volume that includes fifteen chapters as well as an introduction by the editors: my omissions should not be taken as anything but the consequence of my decision to place the emphasis elsewhere. And if I bring up only a couple of quibbles, this is because any other complaints would have been so trivial as to be unworthy of mention, which indicates the quality of the book taken as a whole. Even the critical remark I to which I now turn is not a sign of dissatisfaction with any part of this volume so much as a tension that is not obviously resolved in Kierkegaard and Death, for reasons that have to do with Kierkegaard's own writings.

Apart from a few scattered remarks to the effect that death may not turn out to be "the end," most of Kierkegaard and Death leaves aside the topic of the afterlife, in accordance with what is stated by the editors in their Introduction, i.e., that Kierkegaard's work is primarily oriented toward finite human existence and that he largely avoids the topic of personal immortality. And yet, as Tamara Monet Marks observes in the final chapter, there is undeniable evidence that Kierkegaard himself did believe in this possibility, or that he held out hope for it. When his religious discourses and his discussions of faith address themselves to the predicament of mortal human beings, who are going to die, is he dwelling on this subject only for the sake of those infidels who are not in on the secret that we don't really die, or that death is not the end? If so, then Kierkegaard's views might seem to be a fit target for Philip Larkin's cynical remark about religion as a game "created to pretend we never die,"[4] which denies the problems of finitude rather than confronting them. If Kierkegaard also offers resources for thinking about our mortality that do not amount to a "denial of death," then how do we reconcile all of his this-worldly philosophical and religious writings with the moments when he seems to be immortality-obsessed? For the latter do exist, as Marks points out, even if they are outnumbered, as the editors indicate. Although there is clearly a form of Kierkegaardian existential faith that does not deny our finitude, what about the other elements of Kierkegaard's work that seem to conflict with this? By ending with this question, I don't mean to imply that I know how to answer it -- but someone ought to.

[1] Pierre Hadot, Philosophy as a Way of Life, ed. by Arnold I. Davidson, trans. by Michael Chase (Oxford: Blackwell, 1995), 187.

[2] The 1845 discourse "At a Graveside" appears as the third of Three Discourses on Imagined Occasions, trans. by Hong & Hong (Princeton, 1993), 69-102.

[3] As far as I'm aware, the best discussion of these themes in Fear and Trembling is found in Chapters 2 and 3 of Sharon Krishek's Kierkegaard on Faith and Love(Cambridge, 2009).

[4] Line 24 of "Aubade," in Selected Poems, ed. by Anthony Thwaite (New York: Farrar, Straus and Giroux, 2003), 190-191.