Kierkegaard and Religion: Personality, Character, and Virtue

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Sylvia Walsh, Kierkegaard and Religion: Personality, Character, and Virtue, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 245pp., $92.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107180581.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Hanson, Human Flourishing Program at Harvard University


Sylvia Walsh's newest book addresses a constellation of issues that are arrayed around the influence of Kierkegaard's religious conceptuality on his view of how personality, character, and virtue are shaped. The topics included under this capacious heading end up ranging widely, both across theme and the chronology of Kierkegaard's authorship. Walsh announces early in her Prologue that

No thinker has reflected more deeply on the role of religion in forming the human self than the Danish religious poet Søren Kierkegaard (1813-1855), who produced in little more than a decade an astonishing number of works devoted to an analysis of the kind of personality, character, and spiritual qualities needed to become an authentic human being or self. (2)

The replacement here of the term "virtue" in the book's title with the words "spiritual qualities" is deliberate. The most pointed thesis that the book argues is that Kierkegaard in his many and pluriform writings on the self "does not use the language of virtue to describe the spiritual qualities that characterize human selfhood, personality, and character, even expressing a negative view toward virtue in some of his works" (3-4). Walsh's most distinctive argument is also the most difficult to prove. I will spend most of this review raising some concerns about it, but my intent in doing so is not to criticize but to show how Walsh is absolutely right that Kierkegaard is committed to articulating a view of human character that is robustly informed by religious categories. I only differ in thinking that Kierkegaard is interested in virtue and most specifically in its transformation by Christian revelation, a theme that I think sensitivity to the dialectical character of Kierkegaard's reasoning will bring out more fully, which in turn I think complements more than challenges Walsh's work.

In the early chapters, Walsh guides the reader effectively through Kierkegaard's first writings on personality and the formation of a life-view, drawing on neglected texts like From the Papers of One Still Living and The Concept of Irony. She convincingly shows that Kierkegaard's view of the formation of the human self is from his most youthful writings robustly teleological, guided by free choices, and strongly informed by his Lutheran Christianity. Following a solid but necessarily truncated study of major character studies (the usual suspects -- "A" and Judge William from Either/Or, the tax collector from Fear and Trembling) from Kierkegaard's principal pseudonymous texts, Walsh turns to her pivotal argument on virtue in Kierkegaard.

Walsh admits that defining what virtue ethics is or entails can be controversial and that there is a diversity of features that one might point to as necessary to or frequently occurring in connection with any such definition (74-76). Canvassing in brief some of those thinkers who have allied Kierkegaard with the virtue tradition, she professes herself unsure as to how that tradition has re-emerged in prominence (78). In connection with Kierkegaard studies, however, there is no mystery. The discussion is almost completely attributable to the aftermath of Alasdair MacIntyre's After Virtue and its widely panned misinterpretation of Kierkegaard. The corrective offered on Kierkegaard's behalf spawned a cottage industry, for many of those leading the countercharge maintained not only that MacIntyre's reading of Kierkegaard was mistaken but that Kierkegaard was in fact a potential ally to much of what MacIntyre wanted to say in that seminal volume. While Walsh touches on some figures allied to that project (including John Davenport and Anthony Rudd, who co-edited the influential collection Kierkegaard After MacIntyre), she does not take due measure of the full weight now gathered behind the Kierkegaard-as-virtue-theorist school of thought. (A search of "Kierkegaard" and "virtue" on Philosopher's Index yields 87 hits, a crude but nonetheless indicative metric that does not include the many studies of Kierkegaard's accounts of various moral phenomena that can be regarded as virtues or at least virtuous -- faith, hope, love, striving, suffering, guilt, repentance, courage, humility, etc.)

While Walsh disputes that Kierkegaard can be viewed "as a virtue ethicist in line with classical, medieval, and contemporary virtue ethics" (82-83), no one in the Kierkegaard-as-virtue-theorist camp would so view him nor could they. Classical, medieval, and contemporary virtue ethics differ wildly internally and with one another. Any individual commentator who aligns Kierkegaard with virtue theory is bound to qualify the claim as to what sort of virtue theory they have in mind, and given the diversity of such theories a number of such alignments have been assayed, some with more success than others.

Walsh points out that Kierkegaard uses the term "virtue" rarely, and that is so, but she omits certain key uses of the term and underplays other significant references or fails to see their significance. For example, the term usually translated as "virtue" (Dyd) occurs admittedly in only one setting in Fear and Trembling, and yet it is loaded with significance. In Problema I Johannes de Silentio is contrasting the faith of Abraham with the dutifulness of the tragic hero. The tragic hero like Agamemnon or Brutus or Jephthah sacrifices a private obligation for a higher one, allowing their greater duty to the state to override their lesser duty to their family, such that their actions, while shocking, retain the comprehensible character of a difficult but ethically defensible action. Abraham by contrast does not act on a higher ethical obligation but sets out to act in such a way that the whole sphere of the ethical itself is sacrificed to an ostensibly higher obligation that is not within the scope of the ethical. In the words of Walsh's own translation, "While the tragic hero is therefore great by his ethical virtue, Abraham is great by a purely personal virtue."[1]

What "purely personal virtue" means is a matter of some speculation, but the implication seems to be that there is both continuity and distinction in the relationship between Abraham's action and that of the tragic hero. Both are called a form of virtue, but the tragic hero's is easily describable within the purview of the ethical as universal, while Abraham's action points toward a new form of virtue that can be exhibited only by the individual in a relationship with the absolute that is God. For this reason Johannes de Silentio claims that "Here the necessity of a new category for understanding Abraham becomes apparent. Such a relationship to the divine is unknown in paganism. The tragic hero does not enter into any private relation to the deity."[2] If you take the view that I do, that there is in Fear and Trembling (as well as in The Sickness unto Death and The Concept of Anxiety) a close and sustained relationship between explicit paganism and the many ethical forms of life that belong more loosely to what we might call, to use Lutheran terminology, "the natural man," then you would be inclined to view this key passage as evidence that Kierkegaard is at once criticizing the forms of virtue typical of the pagans and natural humanity (note, too, that Johannes de Silentio's examples of tragic heroes are all drawn from non-Christian sources: Greek myth, Roman history, Hebrew Scripture) and gesturing toward the need for a specifically Christian account of virtue. Given that Walsh is interested in how religion shapes character, it would seem that this passage should be useful to her project, but it goes unmentioned.

Similarly, Walsh quotes a telling image from The Concept of Irony (which arguably contains an immature view of Socrates, one that has developed significantly by the time of Kierkegaard's final writings, the very last of which still are concerned, even obsessed, with Socrates), where a juvenile Kierkegaard is arguing that Socrates made of virtue such an abstraction that "it only becomes the rock upon which the individual virtues, like well-freighted sailing vessels, run aground and are smashed to pieces" (82). She interprets this passage as clear evidence that Kierkegaard holds a negative view of virtue, but again the truth is more complicated. The image of a shipwreck is one that returns in The Concept of Anxiety and Fear and Trembling and Repetition, where it is consistently used to illustrate the destruction of one sphere (the ethical or the aesthetic) and with the consequent coming to birth of a new sphere (the religious).

For instance, in the introduction to The Concept of Anxiety, Vigilius Haufniensis writes that "Sin, then, belongs to ethics only insofar as upon this concept it is shipwrecked with the aid of repentance."[3] For Kierkegaard, sin-consciousness is the first article of religious faith; before there can be forgiveness of sin one must be convicted of one's sin, but at this point one has moved beyond the limits of the ethical and into the religious. Repentance is at once the zenith and the downfall of the ethical, since to repent is to admit that one has failed ethically, but ethics itself has no resources to cope with such a failure. All ethics can do is repeat its demands, with greater emphasis if necessary. Thus is ethics "shipwrecked," that is, it comes to ruin on the rocks of reality. Once more, Kierkegaard's pseudonymous author closely links this limited conception of ethics with paganism, asserting that "Sin's skepticism is altogether foreign to paganism."[4] This is why Haufniensis, too, calls for new categories to articulate a "second ethics,"[5] which I would argue is one built on specifically religious revelation and thus able to come to the rescue of the shipwrecked ethics of paganism. If this is correct, then the early quote from The Concept of Irony, where Kierkegaard tries out the shipwreck image, can be seen not as an unequivocal condemnation of virtue itself but as a preliminary stab at a more sophisticated plan to rehabilitate Christian ethics in the wake of the failed limits of pagan ethics. This is no mere historic point either; as Walsh recognizes, "paganism is a much broader category than classical paganism for Kierkegaard, encompassing all those within modern Christendom who call themselves Christians but actually live within pagan categories" (98).

At one point Walsh astutely picks up on an analogous argument from Kierkegaard that there is a link between virtue and what he derisively calls "sagacity," by which he means worldly wisdom, a cleverness unchastened by religious humility. Virtue, he writes in one of his veronymous upbuilding discourses, is the highest sagacity, and at the same time true virtue would aspire to the genuinely highest good in human life, not merely flirt with the pretense of doing so. If this were to happen, though, the superficial person's concept of sagacity would have to be completely altered. Walsh notes that "Kierkegaard does not elaborate on what such a transformed conception of sagacity or prudence would be or how it might help one to acquire virtue" (85). I am arguing though that he does in many of his writings at least point toward the way in which such a transformation would take place. If I am right about the dialectical nature of Kierkegaard's typical argumentation, concepts like sagacity and the ethical and even virtue are all being stretched to their limits to show how they might be reinvented in the light of religious faith.

The need for a dialectical reading is again apparent when Walsh turns to the Concluding Unscientific Postscript, where according to her reading Johannes Climacus teaches that

While growth and sanctification in the good is possible through the constant acquisition of spiritual goods, which are perfect in themselves inasmuch as they come from God, the highest perfection of a human being consists not in the achievement of the good by one's own agency but in understanding that one is incapable of doing anything at all by oneself and thus of one's increasing need of God. (91)

This is quite accurate, but at the same time (and here Kierkegaard's bedrock Lutheranism kicks in) we are by no means relieved of responsibility for energetic action. On the very same page Walsh admits that "constant activity on our part as unworthy servants and co-workers of God in giving them [spiritual goods] expression in our daily lives is also required" (91). Both of these can be true at once if salvation is at once a free gift of God and we are simultaneously required to work out that salvation in fear and trembling (Phil. 2:12). Walsh rightly points out this dynamic happening at many places in Kierkegaard's authorship (94-95; 104-105), citing for instance his memorable image of the oarsman who rows toward a destination that he is precisely facing away from, his back turned not toward but against his destination (147). For Kierkegaard to go backward is to go forward.

The question is whether this dialectical dynamic precludes Kierkegaard from being interested in virtue. I don't see why it would. For Kierkegaard, our own striving is not blunted by the recognition that it does not attain merit but paradoxically it is redoubled by the recognition that we can do nothing on our own power to achieve virtue (the presumption of all pagan ethics, as he repeatedly says in various works: that virtue is within our own power -- in this matter Kierkegaard is simply a completely orthodox Augustinian).[6] Because moral progress entails recognition of my own failure and powerlessness does not mean that the category of virtue has no relevance to an account of that progress. Walsh's odd final proposal to classify Kierkegaard as a "character ethicist" (a term she does not define) instead of a "virtue ethicist" is ultimately unpersuasive (107), and her insistence on using terms like "spiritual qualities" instead of "virtues" starts to seem like it's forcing a semantic rather than substantial distinction.

From here Walsh turns mainly to Kierkegaard's later writings. In these later chapters her account of moral progress is informative and clear and again covers much terrain that is usually neglected or omitted altogether from Kierkegaard's late writings. The fourth chapter on "Existence as a Time of Testing" is beautifully observed and treats some topics that I have not seen handled in this depth and detail before.

The argument against virtue forms a sort of centerpiece to the book, and while I have concentrated my concerns on that part, I think it remains the case that most of the content of Walsh's reconstruction of Kierkegaard's views is quite sound and praiseworthy, and whether we choose to call Kierkegaard a virtue theorist or not ends up being a separate issue.

[1] Søren Kierkegaard, Fear and Trembling, ed. C. Stephen Evans and Sylvia Walsh, tr. Sylvia Walsh (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2006), 52.

[2] Ibid.

[3] Søren Kierkegaard, The Concept of Anxiety, ed. and tr. Reidar Thomte (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1980), 17.

[4] Ibid., 19.

[5] Ibid., 20-21, 23.

[6] See The City of God, Book XIX, Chapter 4.