Kierkegaard and Socrates: A Study in Philosophy and Faith

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Jacob Howland, Kierkegaard and Socrates: A Study in Philosophy and Faith, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 231pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521862035.

Reviewed by George Pattison, Oxford University


Jacob Howland's study is an essentially modest and exegetical work that, in large part, delivers what it sets out to do. It does so in a clear and unabashedly enthusiastic manner, mostly making good its claim not to presuppose that the reader has 'more than a general knowledge of the vocabulary of philosophy' (p. 2). Howland opens his Introduction by telling us how he first came to read Kierkegaard's Philosophical Fragments and of the impact its 'brilliance', 'ardor', and 'mystery' made on him. He acknowledges that this present book was conceived in that first passionate response, however much it may also have been subsequently informed by and be addressed to the discourse of contemporary academic philosophy -- all of which is very much in line with the role that Kierkegaard and Kierkegaard's Socrates gives to passion in the quest for truth, philosophical or religious. For it is central to Howland's argument that passion -- or, to use the Socratic-Platonic term, eros -- is, as he puts it, capable of becoming 'a ladder by which one could climb up to an understanding of faith' (p. 137).

It should be said straightaway that the title of the book is somewhat misleading. For, apart from an Epilogue in which a larger perspective is opened up, this study limits itself to the writings by Kierkegaard's arguably most intimate pseudonym, Johannes Climacus. These are: the unfinished draft of Climacus's philosophical autobiography (Johannes Climacus or De Omnibus Dubitandum Est), the Philosophical Fragments, and Concluding Unscientific Postscript to the Philosophical Fragments. Of these, it is very much the Fragments that takes centre stage, with the earlier 'autobiography' and the later 'Postscript' being assigned a chapter each, leaving the eight central chapters to a detailed study of the Fragments and, in particular, of the role played by Socrates in that work. The Epilogue draws attention to some interesting and important journal passages where Kierkegaard seems not merely to speak of Socrates as a proto-Christian but almost as a proto-Christ, but there is no significant discussion of Socrates' role in, e.g., The Concept of Irony, Works of Love, or The Sickness unto Death. As far as this reviewer can see there is no use of that most striking of the theses for which Kierkegaard's master's dissertation argued -- that the similarity between Socrates and Christ consists in their dissimilarity (although it would have made a nice foil to Howland's own argument, which could be read as a rather neat inversion of the Kierkegaardian thesis, namely, that the dissimilarity between Socrates and Christ lies in their similarity). Nor is there much discussion of previous literature in which the Socratic dimension of Kierkegaard's authorship has been extensively discussed -- although this omission probably helps the exegetical focus of Howland's exposition, and is in part compensated for by the additional perspectives on Kierkegaard's text that his own expertise in classical philosophy makes possible. In the light of these comments, the book would have been better titled Johannes Climacus and Socrates -- and it is certainly better read as a contribution to that more limited task. This, it should be emphasized, is not of itself a criticism of the content, merely a guideline for reading and evaluating what is being offered. As a study in the Climacan writings, and above all the Fragments, Howland's work is enriching. As a study of Kierkegaard and Socrates, it leaves much more to be said.

Central to the book's argument is that the sharp and, apparently, irreconcilable dichotomy between 'the Socratic' and 'the Christian' drawn in the opening chapter of the Fragments, is neither as sharp nor as irreconcilable as it appears. On the contrary, Climacus seems very Socrates-like in his own manner of proceeding 'beyond' Socrates, whilst Socrates -- not least if we take the testimony of Plato into account -- seems rather less 'Socratic' and rather more 'believing'.

The Socrates-like character of Johannes Climacus derives preliminary support from the choice of name for this pseudonym (originally the name of a minor Church Father), implying (as it seems) the idea of an ascent from the human to the divine. This is deepened by the palpable philosophical eros of the young Johannes Climacus, as represented in the eponymous autobiographical fragment. Howland acknowledges there are reasons not to conflate this Johannes Climacus with the pseudonymous author of published works, but he nevertheless sees a continuity in both style and substance that is evidenced at a number of points in the Fragments. The key points here are the role of eros, the requirement that philosophy be lived, and the notion that certain moral and religious truths gain authority from being lived with conviction, sincerity, and integrity. As for Socrates himself, Howland draws on the Apology to argue that, far from being the pure representative of immanent eros/recollection (as portrayed in Chapter 1 of the Fragments), Socrates' work was also a kind of divine commission -- even if, as Howland points out, Socrates is more than a little secretive about the nature and scope of this commission. The outcome is that philosophy -- Socratic philosophy, that is -- 'has two roots: it is answerable to, and authorized by, the god, but also by what Socrates calls eros' (p. 59). This is so because 'it is the oracle that arouses, focuses, and validates his [Socrates'] desire for wisdom' (p. 67). Later in the book, Howland will also give attention to the analogies between Socrates' daimon and Climacus's 'unknown' in terms of how each sets a limit to human consciousness whilst, at the same time, serving to summon the individual to self-transcendence in the direction of 'the mysterious world that lies beyond the boundaries of what is initially taken to be one's self' (p. 114). Climacus's own characterization thus

fails to capture certain essential dimensions of Socrates' philosophical enterprise. In particular … [that] this enterprise depends on something akin to the faith that is required for learning in accordance with the religious hypothesis (p. 76).

Yet the similarity between the Christian and the Socratic is also marked by dissimilarity, as Howland concedes. This is especially so if we once take into account the moment of 'the god's' incarnation as a defining moment of his 'teaching' and 'redeeming' work. In a certain perspective, Socrates too speaks from a kind of divine knowledge to other mortals, and thus participates in both the divine and the human worlds. Yet Socrates is ambiguous in both his divine and his human roles, neither unambiguously divine nor unambiguously human. The paradox of the god incarnate, however, is that He is both unambiguously divine and unambiguously human. The Christian learner, moreover, is not merely a seeker, s/he is also someone seeking to come to terms with what has been given -- 'whereas philosophy is engaged in the task of questing to discover the truth, faith concentrates on accepting a task that is given', as Howland puts it (p. 203). Both with regard to the object of faith and to the way in which s/he believes, the Christian's situation therefore seems to be marked by a kind of definiteness or non-irony that is different from the Socratic position. Yet Howland holds to the insight that there is something about the dialectic of eros/love that modifies even this contrast.

Howland's argument is, in broad terms, persuasive. Kierkegaard's love-affair with Socrates is far too complex, deep, and extended throughout his authorship for the kind of black and white disjunction with which Climacus's book opens to hold water. Howland is also substantially correct in seeing that this disjunction doesn't even do justice to Climacus's own position. Yet perhaps he does not really sufficiently weigh the impact of sin on Climacus's/Kierkegaard's thinking with regard to the dialectic of the Socratic and the Christian. In Fragments itself, this is what is said to be decisive for the difference between the Socratic. On Howland's reading the issue seems to be a more general one, namely the relationship between immanence and transcendence, rather than the impossible encounter of a holy God and a sinful individual. The problem is not just that God is in heaven and we are on earth, but that God is the holy one in whom and before whom not even the slightest blemish of unholiness can be found, whilst we are corrupt in the very centre of our being. Howland largely glosses over this problem by appealing to Anthony Rudd's comment that we cannot take at face value the religious claim 'that we have simply lost all contact with the Truth' (footnote, p. 50) through sin -- but this is undoubtedly a claim that not a few religious believers (especially in Kierkegaard's own Protestant tradition) do take 'at face value'. As for Kierkegaard, it is not only here in the Fragments that he makes such a claim, in his own voice, or in the voice of one or other pseudonym. I do not say that this closes the discussion, and The Sickness unto Death will revisit the question of sin with express regard to the relationship between Christian and Socratic understandings, but it is a point that needed fuller exploration than it is given here. On Kierkegaardian premises the Socratic could only be assimilated to the Christian if it was able to pass through and to internalize the ontological trauma of sinfulness, and that must surely colour any exercise in assimilation more deeply than in Howland's study.

A further, and relatively minor point (though arguably one with serious ramifications), is in the discussion of the Interlude. Howland follows Climacus in distinguishing between the 'what' and the 'how' of historical existence and, correspondingly, between scientific and prophetic interpretations of history. But, he suggests, Climacus doesn't follow through on his own problem. For the real test case, not mentioned by Climacus (yet, according to Howland, it 'is surely foremost' in his mind [p. 165]) is that of the birth of 'a certain man' in Bethlehem. How did this happen, asks Howland -- and how can we separate the question of its significance from this 'how'? 'Did it happen according to nature, or according to divine agency?' Howland asks. But this is to suggest that the issue of the Virgin Birth qua article of faith is dependent on the question of historical fact, i.e. (in this case), an historically occurring miracle. However, it seems to the present reviewer far more plausible to see Kierkegaard/Climacus here as fully accepting of the Schleiermacherian paradigm, within which the question of the historical (or, we might say, biological) miracle is strictly separated from the religious issue, the true miracle of the God appearing, in time, as a human being.

There is much for readers of Kierkegaard to gain from this study, and much that is said with charm, insight, and nuance. But there is also much more to be said and much more that needs to be said before the interrelated question of the multiple relationships between Kierkegaard, Climacus, Christ, the Christian believer and Socrates is fully clarified. But, then again, that's probably as it should be in philosophical work.