Kierkegaard and the Catholic Tradition: Conflict and Dialogue

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Jack Mulder, Jr., Kierkegaard and the Catholic Tradition: Conflict and Dialogue, Indiana University Press, 2010, 283pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780253222367.

Reviewed by John Lippitt, University of Hertfordshire


Some have suggested that the trajectory of Kierkegaard's thought is such that, had he lived longer, he might have ended up in Rome. Though he does not advance this claim, in this original and thought-provoking study Jack Mulder seeks to work out where prospects exist for fruitful dialogue between Kierkegaard and Catholicism, where they part company, and where he thinks the latter captures better a Kierkegaardian idea. He divides the book into two main parts -- "Nature and Grace" and "Sin, Justification, and Community" -- and the themes he covers include natural theology, natural moral law and special revelation, agapic and preferential love, apostolic authority, hell, purgatory, perfect and imperfect contrition, and the communion of saints. The two-fold division is largely explained by Mulder's view that the two major differences between Kierkegaard and the Catholic tradition are the former's 'antipathy toward, or at least lack of' (p. 224) a Thomistic conception of nature, and the way that his largely Lutheran understanding of justification impacts his view of repentance, the Church and purgatory (ibid.)

One of the most valuable aspects of Mulder's book is the reflection it promotes on the possible conversation between Kierkegaard and St. Thomas Aquinas. In chapter 2, for example, in a discussion of Fear and Trembling, Mulder argues that the focus Kierkegaard's pseudonym Johannes de Silentio places on Abraham's faith as being for this life downplays models of Christian martyrdom in which the martyrs' projects can only be fulfilled 'outside their earthly lives' (p. 54). And he argues that Aquinas' natural law ethics does a better job of representing what Johannes wants to prize in Abraham than does the pseudonym's own discussion.

Where the comparison between Aquinas and Kierkegaard pays the highest dividends, for me, is in chapter 3, on the 'order of love'. Part of the issue at stake here is whether the specific obligations we have to our families and friends are such that we have an obligation to prioritise them over the 'neighbour' who is a stranger. To use Mulder's example, if I can only afford one winter coat for my child, and yet see another child equally in need, should my own child take priority? Mulder notes that the Catholic tradition has typically claimed that our families have a greater claim on our resources than strangers, and that it has sometimes also been claimed that we should love them more than strangers (p. 68). Kierkegaard has often been thought to be excessively suspicious about such 'preferential' loves. Much work has been done to defend Kierkegaard against his harshest critics -- such as Theodor Adorno -- on this point. Yet an uncomfortable suspicion remains that in such defences, troubling elements of Kierkegaard's account are glossed over.

What is most interesting about Mulder's treatment of this topic is his claim that the real issue at stake is not preference but nature (p. 96); not between preferential and non-preferential loves so much as how deeply defective (or otherwise) is 'natural' love. Hence, in a brief discussion of Aristotle on friendship and self-love, Mulder argues that for Kierkegaard, given his Lutheran heritage, even an Aristotelian 'perfect' friendship would count as sinful and not 'real' love (pp. 74, 85). This is the position, Mulder thinks, which needs Aquinas and the Thomist tradition as a corrective. Drawing on the idea that grace does not destroy nature but perfects it, Mulder sides with Aquinas in arguing that 'the natural affection we have for those who are closest to us by way of blood-relationships or other such ties is reasonable and is not nullified by Christian charity' (p. 81). Yet the two figures are not poles apart. Kierkegaard agrees with Aquinas that we ought to love God more than ourselves. Both seem to hold some version of the view that all love is rooted in love of God (p. 80). And both, Mulder argues, view love of neighbour as arising out of this love for God (p. 95).

I find much to admire in this analysis. If Mulder is right, then this lends support to John Henry Newman's idea that it is in the arena of the love of friends and family that we develop the patience, kindness and inspiration from which a more all-encompassing charity and love of neighbour can grow. I do think that Kierkegaard's worries about preferential loves and the more egregious aspects of taking charity to 'begin at home' sometimes blind him to this possibility, and that there is much to be said for the greater trust Aquinas seems to have in our natural affinities. A similar point applies to self-love. Mulder clearly states that for Kierkegaard, as for Aquinas, the second love commandment does not oblige us to love the neighbour more than oneself. So Kierkegaard's position is not the radical asymmetry between self and other of, say, Levinas. But this element is sometimes drowned out by Kierkegaard's focus on self-denial -- 'Christianity's essential form', as he puts it in Works of Love -- and related terms. Mulder argues for a 'partial reconciliation' between Kierkegaard and the Catholic tradition on the basis of a discussion of self-love. He notes, in the Bousset-Fenelon dispute, the Catholic Church's condemnation of propositions to the effect that love of God should be entirely free of self-interest (p. 92), and that tradition's willingness to approve what Edward Vacek has called 'an eros love of God for the sake of our own happiness' (cited p. 92), provided the latter remains a subordinate theme. Mulder finds hints of this in Kierkegaard too, in contrast to the latter's 'official position' (p. 93).

This interesting theme emerges again later, in chapter 7. Indeed, one thing I would like to have seen worked out in more detail is Mulder's claim, following Daphne Hampson, that in Kierkegaard love of God is a kind of 'higher eros' (p. 191). Presumably what is in focus here is the 'heart' that Kierkegaard claims must be formed, and out of which we love. Such an account might enable interpreters to use Kierkegaard against himself, to combat some of the more extreme overegging, in some of his more Levinasian moments, of the notion of self-denial. Towards the end of this chapter, Mulder is keen to show that Aquinas' conception of love is no less self-sacrificing than Kierkegaard's (p. 96). But here we need to be careful. I would not wish to deny that the Christian life calls for self-sacrifice, but -- as feminist theologians in particular have reminded us -- to put too much of the emphasis here risks failing to recognise an important aspect of the idea that 'I too am a neighbour': the self-respect that is part of truly accepting ourselves and our lives as a gift.

The Catholic tradition's greater overall tolerance of certain varieties of self-love and self-interest is at the heart of Mulder's defence, in chapter 6, of 'imperfect contrition', in which one seeks atonement partly out of fear of damnation, rather than exclusively out of the pure love of God. Indeed, Mulder argues for the official Catholic line that to be imperfectly contrite is a divine gift (p. 154) -- for, as Kierkegaard would put it, 'upbuilding': 'an important vehicle to forgiveness and beatitude' (p. 161). This relates also to chapter 7's intriguing discussion of purgatory, where Mulder's line is that it is only because of Kierkegaard's Lutheran heritage that he fails to engage directly with a doctrine that, understood in a certain way, is potentially quite compatible with his overall position.

The picture of contemporary Catholicism's view of hell that emerges from Mulder's book is, if this is not too crass a phrase, refreshingly uncrowded. In chapter 5, Mulder goes to some lengths to argue that it has to be possible that hell is non-empty, against those of his fellows who hold that it in principle must be empty (p. 128). But at the end of that chapter he stresses that 'I have nowhere attempted to argue that some individuals do in fact so decisively reject God that hell turns out not to be empty' (p. 152).

This is a thoughtful, clearly written and valuable book. There are some surprising omissions: probably the most influential contemporary Thomist moral philosopher, Alasdair MacIntyre, is conspicuous by his absence, despite there being considerable interest in affinities between his thought and Kierkegaard's. Nor does Mulder discuss such twentieth-century Catholic readers of Kierkegaard as Baron Friedrich von Hügel or Romano Guardini, through whom Hans Urs von Balthasar (whom Mulder does discuss) learned of Kierkegaard. But perhaps the biggest surprise of all is that a sustained comparison between Kierkegaard and the Catholic tradition such as Mulder endeavours to produce here has not been attempted before. Mulder's work has set running an interesting set of hares, and well deserves further reflection and discussion.