Kierkegaard and the Life of Faith: The Aesthetic, the Ethical and the Religious in Fear and Trembling,

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Jeffrey Hanson, Kierkegaard and the Life of Faith: The Aesthetic, the Ethical and the Religious in Fear and Trembling, Indiana University Press, 2017, 245pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253024701.


Reviewed by Ada S. Jaarsma, Mount Royal University


Søren Kierkegaard’s writings, when taken as a coherent whole, asks interpreters to make sense of tensions between Kierkegaard’s pseudonymous authors. Pseudonyms might use the same term (“aesthetic,” for example, or “ethical”) but animate them from their own existential perspectives. An aesthete’s reflections on “the ethical,” for example, differ from an ethicist’s reflections, and it falls to the readers to resolve such discrepancies by anchoring interpretations in an overarching account of Kierkegaard’s project. In his lively exegetical treatment of Fear and Trembling, written by pseudonymous author Johannes de Silentio, Jeffrey Hanson offers an inventive anchor for securing such coherence: he looks to the commentary of a different pseudonym, Vigilius Haufniensis, as the key to unlocking the text’s insights in ways that align with Kierkegaard’s more religious writings.


What emerges is a Fear and Trembling that gestures towards Christian ethics. As he explains, Hanson’s ambition is to treat the book as a whole, including passages that are often overlooked, and to approach Silentio’s stories and vignettes as elements that illustrate the book’s overall argument: namely, that aesthetics and ethics are realms of existence that become transformed through the religious. Hanson lays out this thesis at the beginning of his book and proceeds, section by section, to close readings of Silentio’s text that forge connections to the other pseudonyms’ texts and to influential commentaries on Fear and Trembling. By reading Fear and Trembling through a footnote in Haufniensis’s The Concept of Anxiety, Hanson makes a compelling case for how Silentio’s text aligns with and advances the broader Kierkegaardian project, cast as oriented in particular to the Christian (or “second”) ethics of Kierkegaard’s direct writings. Hanson takes Silentio at his word when he admits to lacking the capacity to understand the meaning of faith or sin. This admission leads Hanson to look beyond the bounds of Fear and Trembling to The Concept of Anxiety for an account that more fully captures the significance of Silentio’s text.


Here is the import of Fear and Trembling according to this footnote by Haufniensis:


In this book, the author [Silentio] several times allows the desired ideality of esthetics to be shipwrecked on the required ideality of ethics, in order through these collisions to bring to light the religious ideality as the ideality that precisely is the ideality of actuality, and therefore just as desirable as that of esthetics and not as impossible as the ideality of ethics (1981, 17n).


On Hanson’s reading, this footnote invokes the “second” or renewed ethics that emerges only through revelation, and he reads Fear and Trembling as a text that dramatizes this thesis. The “ideality” of aesthetics refers to storytelling conventions that will never capture our everyday experiences; the “ideality” of ethics, in turn, refers to moral perfection that we, as actors, will never achieve; these two realms of ideality are transformed through the work of “revealed” ethics. As Hanson puts it, where ethics “crushes without uplifting” (5) and where aesthetics lifts conventions above actual lived experience (7), the religious brings the ideal together with the actual (11).


In addition to his exegetical examination of Silentio’s text, Hanson is interested in more speculative questions about the implications of Fear and Trembling. As he explains in the introduction, “To speak of ethics as being shipwrecked on the rock of sin and repentance means that the careful expositor must be prepared to reinvent ethics on the basis of the destruction of the ethical ideal” (5). What’s innovative in this description of Fear and Trembling is the isomorphism that Hanson draws between the resignation of the ethical ideal and the resignation of the aesthetic ideal (12). This is a convincing way to make sense of the interpretative challenge that results from the pseudonyms’ differing relations to “the aesthetic,” “the ethical” and “the religious.” Hanson’s account is one that affirms a robust continuity between the various pseudonyms. If the aesthetic is also “resigned,” along analogical lines to the resignation of the “ethical,” then Fear and Trembling proffers insights that help deepen our understanding of Kierkegaard’s more “religious” writings. This is an interpretative leap in that it knits together the “second” or Christian ethics with Silentio’s musings.


Hanson draws out the implications of Silentio’s text by asking: could there be other knights of faith, and if so, who are they? Hanson opens up these questions by way of another interpretative leap, claiming that the forgiveness of sins is a paradigmatic case of the teleological suspension of the ethical (26). “There is more than one way to teleologically suspend the ethical,” he asserts (155). And this is an important claim of the book. The ethical-as-universal is rendered, by Hanson, as “any ethical thinking that remains untransformed by specifically religious revelation” (26). This seems largely to be an epistemic treatment of the ethical: the ethical-as-universal is unable to make sense of sin or faith, and so it is divine revelation that expands the bounds of understanding. By shifting emphasis from Abraham as the exemplar of faith to Abraham as one instantiation of faith, Hanson opens Fear and Trembling up to a particular Christian account of religious ethics.


The first chapters attend, in particular, to the performative work enacted by Silentio’s literary strategies. In this way, they advance Hanson’s claims that the ideals of aesthetics must fail, on Silentio’s account, and that these ideals include Silentio’s own stylistic choices. Chapter 1, “Titular Matters,” considers the title, Fear and Trembling, and Silentio’s status as a pseudonymous author. Chapter 2, “A Philosophical Preface,” turns to the four preliminary sections of Fear and Trembling, which Hanson describes as “experiments with different methodologies” (39). Silentio is intentionally slowing down the reader, Hanson suggests, linking movement with stability in a way that mirrors “the structure of the self and the life lived by a self” (41). The life lived by a self, moreover, can be beset by doubt or by faith; in each case, the ideal collides with the real.


By forging an analogy between doubt and faith in this way, Hanson is able to make an unexpected and original interpretation: “My assertion is that Silentio is stylizing Descartes as a knight of faith” (46). Descartes, the exemplar of doubt, models the double movement of faith in that he resigns an ideal (in this case, the ideal of knowledge-acquisition) because of the force of reality (in which he realizes his own ignorance), and this ideal can only be reborn through faith in God. This portrait of a philosophical knight of faith, Hanson suggests, entreats the reader qua philosopher to confront the possibility of undergoing spiritual trial along similar lines to Abraham (49).


Chapter 3, “A Narrative Approach,” takes the four false Abrahams  as vignettes that further Silentio’s account of faith as a test for believers. Chapter 4, “A Rhetorical Rehearsal,” explores the Eulogy as an abstract literary experiment. Silentio is satirizing poetry, Hanson suggests, rather than exemplifying it: rhetoric itself cannot communicate what it means to have faith. Poetry and rhetoric serve as examples of the aesthetic ideal, for Hanson, and as such they must fail in the face of the actual. Just so, Hanson argues, the eulogy can be read as a “strategic failure” (76). Hanson looks to Kevin Hoffman’s important commentary on Fear and Trembling in order to complicate the tendency by many readers to focus either on the knife in Abraham’s hand or on divine agency (see Hoffman 2006). Hanson shares Hoffman’s commitment to reading Silentio’s exposition of Abraham’s ordeal as one that pertains to the human condition at large (83). Faith, on this score, has this-worldly significance.


Chapter 5, “Beginning from the Heart,” advances Hanson’s argument that The Concept of Anxiety holds the key to making sense of Fear and Trembling as a text that affirms the relevance of faith for everyday experiences of anxieties, loss and finitude. This argument helps us reconsider what Haufniensis might mean when he aligns “anxiety” with “education”: as Hanson puts it, “faith saves the finite as such” (106). The knight of faith is approachable and intuitively understandable, on this account; he models a way for each of us to ask: “How does one relate to the actuality of one’s situation” (114)? Cast in these terms, the absurd is not an issue for logic, but rather for lived existence. Resignation marks openness to the limits of ideals, whether these ideals extend to one’s fantasies about love, social recognition or other aspects of human life.


Chapter 6, “Teleological Suspensions,” addresses the question of Problema 1 that preoccupies most readers of Fear and Trembling: as Silentio asks, “Is there a teleological suspension of the ethical” (1983, 54)? Hanson’s own take on this question is a lively one: there are many teleological suspensions of the ethical. Jesus’s so-called “hard sayings,” for example, are examples of the teleological suspension. On Hanson’s rendering, the suspension marks the incommensurate difference between “any humanly constructed ethics” and revealed ethics (132). Only the latter holds the capacity for attending to sin and faith. Religious logic is scandalous because it calls out the insufficiency of “natural” ethics. This is why, Hanson explains, Abraham’s ordeal should be understood as a spiritual trial (135). To teleologically suspend the ethical, on this account, is to confess the arrogance or over-confidence of the ethical-universal.


Chapter 7, “Absolute Duty,” turns to Problema II as an examination of what Hanson suggests we might identify as the Christian or “second” ethics (156). Chapter 8 , “Silence and Speech,” returns to Hanson’s initial argument that Fear and Trembling has import not only for ethics but also for aesthetics. Heeding Haufniensis’ interpretation in The Concept of Anxiety, Hanson approaches Problema III as a set of case studies about aesthetic hiddenness. Abraham is a witness, not a teacher, Hanson reminds us. We return to the aesthetic at this point, he explains, because aesthetics is essential for a full exposition of faithful living. Both the ethical and the aesthetic become renewed realms for the person of faith (192): faith unites the ethical and the aesthetic (195). As Hanson puts it in the book’s conclusion, aesthetics will fail me alone, I will fail the ethical alone, but the life of faith is ideal for me (205). Faith, lived out by believers, should “keep the tasks young and beautiful and inviting to all, since everyone can be the single individual” (200).


Hanson’s argument depends upon a division between what he describes as the real and the ideal, the life that’s lived and the life that’s fantasized. This division marks the very necessity for resignation and faith, and it is healed over, he explains, by way of the “ideal of actuality” of the religious. “To commit is to recommit,” Hanson explains, such that one accepts the limits of one’s own ideals and relates to actuality with both resignation and faith (127). On this rendering of the religious, there is an epistemic as well as an ontological force to faith, since faith recasts the very causality of everyday events in the direction of divine workings. “For the knight of faith,” Hanson claims, “all is providence” (198). And, so, while the import of Fear and Trembling is this-worldly for Hanson, it is also other-worldly: the spiritual trial that prompts the teleological suspension of the ethical comes about “from without, as a divinely ordained means of correcting the pretentions of the ethical itself” (136). The import of Fear and Trembling, as put forward by Hanson, is also extra-textual, in the sense of relying upon insights from other Kierkegaardian texts. (Silentio, as Hanson points out, does not himself profess to be Christian, and so the Christian message that Hanson detects in Fear and Trembling is one that mobilizes commitments that are outside of the bounds of Silentio’s own statements.)


There are other ways to read Fear and Trembling, ones that adhere less to what David J. Kangas describes in his forthcoming book as a “moral-theological” approach to Kierkegaard (2017, 3). Kangas himself models a different mode of interpretation, one that solicits a more singular relation between Kierkegaard’s texts and the reader. Rather than resulting in an ethics that can be generalized as “the ideal of actuality,” Kangas’s approach is one that resists any generalizing beyond the reader’s own encounter with the Kierkegaardian project and that provokes skepticism towards the real/ideal division that underlies Hanson’s exegetical project. The tension between these modes of interpretation is instructive for Kierkegaard scholars, in that it might prompt us to query the very coherence across Kierkegaard’s writings that Hanson’s book persuasively lays out. There may be an either/or here, in other words, between two different relations to fear and trembling. Either reality gives way to the new living ideals of faith (Hanson 126), or reality is always in excess of norms (Kangas 171). Either we can read Fear and Trembling and lay claim to the revealed ethics in which ideals align with actuality, or we can read it as an encounter with the impossibility of representing any ideals, including normative religious ones.


One way to think through the ramifications of this either/or might be to take up Hanson’s suggestion that readers respond skeptically to his descriptions of revealed ethics (151). He recounts, for example, a legal case in which two individuals decide to forgive, publicly in the courtroom, a person who had murdered their children. Forgiveness, in this example, marks the very moral perfection that Hanson aligns with the actuality of religious existence (7). Those who have not undergone the spiritual trial of a knight of faith, in contrast, operate according to what Hanson describes as a “natural ethical system” (136), and manifest an identity that he describes as “the natural man” (146). I wonder about the extent to which the ethical is transformed here. On the one hand, Hanson describes faith as the workings of beauty and moral majesty. On the other, he suggests that we “live actuality as already ideal” because faith “takes the actual to be ideal already” (168). It is up to each reader to assess whether this description turns the “leap” of faith into a certain quietism (in which the status quo passes for ideals that need not be disrupted) or whether it hails the scandal of faith (in which the status quo masks despair that requires the disruptions of fear and trembling).




Hoffman, Kevin. 2006. “Facing Threats to Earthly Felicity: A Reading of Kierkegaard’s Fear and Trembling,” Journal of Religious Ethics 34 (3): 439-459.

Kangas, David J. 2017. Errant Affirmations: On Kierkegaard’s Religious Discourses. Bloomsbury Academic.

Kierkegaard, Søren. 1981. The Concept of Anxiety. Ed. Howard V. Hong & Edna H. Hong. Princeton University Press.

-—- . 1983. Fear and Trembling. Ed. Howard V. Hong & Edna H. Hong. Princeton University Press.