Kierkegaard and the Paradox of Religious Diversity

Placeholder book cover

George B. Connell, Kierkegaard and the Paradox of Religious Diversity, Eerdmans, 2016, 188pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780802868046.

Merold Westphal, Fordham University

Reviewed by Merold Westphal, Fordham University


At least since Heidegger, it has been thought that Kierkegaard remains philosophically interesting only when the distinctly Christian, or even theistic, elements have been peeled away. Current deconstructive readings carry on this tradition. The present volume is the third to appear in a new series entitled "Kierkegaard as a Christian Thinker." The volume and the series presuppose, with more than sufficient reason, that Kierkegaard's writings, whether pseudonymous or in his own name, are best understood as the work of a Christian theist.

George B. Connell admits that Kierkegaard is an unlikely resource for thinking about religious diversity. He did not experience the problem in the way we do today under different historical and cultural circumstances. In particular, his own scheme, pagan-Jew-Christian, is not very helpful for thinking through the issues that confront thoughtful people today, including but not limited to philosophers and theologians. However, before looking elsewhere in Kierkegaard for possible help, Connell devotes his first chapter to this tripartite scheme. He shows us both its roots in Paul, Schleiermacher, and Hans Lassen Martensen (a major Danish Hegelian) and the complexity of the various uses to which Kierkegaard puts it.

Connell finds more helpful the implications of what Kierkegaard says when he is not directly discussing the issue of religious pluralism. The interpretation in chapters two through five is thus constructive and not merely exegetical. He says he is following a Gadamerian hermeneutic that does not restrict the meaning of a text to the author's conscious self-understanding. Unfortunately he describes this as "asking what these texts mean for us today rather than what Kierkegaard had in mind at the time he wrote them" (p. 27,emphasis added). Fortunately his practice is usually more faithful to Gadamer than this formula suggests. For Gadamer insists that interpretation is and ought to be not only "reproductive" but also "productive", and Connell is a careful reader of Kierkegaard who pays attention to the original meaning of the texts (the reproductive task) as well as to their constructive extensions (the productive task). Like Nicholas Wolterstorff in Divine Discourse, he is both a "strict constructionist" and one who treats an author's work as a "living text".

The constructive or productive task of chapters two through five is structured by a scheme borrowed from Philip Quinn. He suggests that the challenge of religious pluralism poses two familiar problems and two novel opportunities. The first familiar problem is that of epistemological conflict, what to do with incompatible truth claims (chapter two). The second of these concerns religious intolerance and religious violence (chapter three). The first novel opportunity is the challenge to define religion so as to include everything that deserves to be called religion without including too much (chapter four). The other opportunity is the challenge of constructive comparisons, juxtaposing religious differences in such a way as better to understand both particular traditions and points of convergence that coexist with deep divergence (chapter five).

Chapter two distinguishes three responses to religious diversity: exclusivism, roughly the view that one religion has a monopoly on truth and salvific power; pluralism, roughly the view that all religions are equally true and redemptive; and inclusivism, roughly the view that "a particular faith is uniquely true but extends salvation beyond the confines of its own religious community" (p. 71). Connell makes a strong case for interpreting the parable of the fervent pagan in Concluding Unscientific Postscript as an instance of inclusivism, since the pagan prays to a false god, an idol, but is said to be better off than a certain kind of complacent Christian who is put to sleep by his religious truth rather than stirred up to a life of striving.

In what may be the book's most creative move, Connell then turns to Kierkegaard's analysis of moods (attitudes more than feelings) and looks at religious diversity through that lens. He associates seriousness with Judge William and Alvin Plantinga as a form of exclusivism. He associates irony with John Hick, Richard Rorty, and John D. Caputo as a form of pluralism. And he associates humor with Miroslav Volf as a form of inclusivism. His sympathy is clearly for the last.

But on Connell's analysis all three moods or attitudes can and should recognize the "objective uncertainty" (a crucial part of Kierkegaard's definition of faith) of our beliefs about God, the Eternal, the Absolute. In this sense all three responses to the "familiar problem" of epistemic conflict have good reason to adopt the same response to the second "familiar problem". That would be the mood or attitude of humility that refuses to adopt the intolerance of disrespect, legal coercion, or violence toward those of differing, even logically incompatible beliefs.

Connell turns in chapter three to the problem of religiously sanctioned violence. In Fear and Trembling Abraham is presented as the father of faith in spite of, or rather because he not only expects to get Isaac back but also because he is willing to sacrifice him in the first place. Connell, mistakenly, I believe, makes the former point the essential one, though Kierkegaard's pseudonym, Johannes de Silentio, labels the discussion of it "preliminary". Perhaps this is a result of Connell's unfortunate decision to treat the story of the Akedah as metaphorical. This is to cut the productive/constructive task loose from the reproductive/exegetical task; for there is no textual support for the notion that either Kierkegaard or Silentio treated the story in this way. That would be to dilute the fear and trembling beyond recognition and to miss Kierkegaard's point.

That point, quite simply, is that in religious faith divine command can trump ethical duty. But the text does not allow the interpreter, including the casual reader, to plug in their meaning of the term 'ethical' and attribute the result to this text. The ethical is defined as the universal. The universal is then explicitly defined, not as some abstract principle like Kant's categorical imperative or Plato's forms, but as a concrete human community. Specifically, the universal is the nation, the state, society, the church, and the sect. In other words, the question is whether any human community, including my religious community, can be the highest standard for my behavior without my taking leave of biblical faith, of which Abraham is the father. For faith, any and every human community is relative and only God is Absolute. This is the transcendence of God; this is the meaning of revelation.

Here begins Kierkegaard's "attack upon Christendom," for his writings repeatedly suggest that in its complacency the Christendom of his day has departed from biblical faith in just this way, idolatrously equating a "Christian" nation with God and its laws and customs with the word of God. The problem is not that under the impact of Enlightenment Christendom insists that religion be rational and that faith be equated with moral rectitude. It is that reason and moral rectitude are defined to begin with in terms of the standards of bourgeois society. Kierkegaard echoes Jesus, when he says

"So for the sake of your tradition you make void the word of God. You hypocrites! Isaiah prophesied rightly about you when he said:

'This people honors me with their lips

but their hearts are far from me;

in vain do they worship me,

teaching human precepts as doctrines.'" (Matt. 15:7-9, NRSV)

The two movies discussed in chapter three, Breaking the Waves and Ordet, are deeply thought provoking, as are Connell's comments on them. But given the decision to treat Genesis 22 in metaphorical terms, it is hard to tell whether they make a significant contribution to understanding Kierkegaard's text. If the story of the Akedah (and Kierkegaard's retelling) are to be exonerated from being a justification of or even an inducement to religiously motivated violence, it will have to be done by taking those texts on their own terms, with all the fear and trembling that involves.

Chapter four turns to the question of defining religion. Noting that Kierkegaard surely thinks that religion is essential to human selfhood, Connell acknowledges a double problem. First, Kierkegaard does not address the scope of religious diversity as we are compelled to do today, and his view of Christianity as unique and definitive makes it hard to think of religion as a genus with many species.

Kierkegaard regularly contrasts immanent with transcendent religion. The former is a general human capacity requiring no historically specific manifestation, brilliantly exhibited in Socrates, whom Kierkegaard admires for understanding that Athens is not God. The latter he finds in biblical religion, usually Christianity, but taking Fear and Trembling into account, also in Judaism. Especially in the writings of Johannes Climacus (Philosophical Fragments and Concluding Unscientific Postscript), Kierkegaard is eager to clarify and emphasize the difference between them and resist the de facto reduction of biblical religion to immanent religion.

Connell suggests that the emphatic emphasis on the difference between the two in Fragments "drains the significance from labeling both as religion" (p. 134). I don't see why, or even that this undermines the notion of religion as a genus. The genus might be defined in terms of a God, or the Eternal, or the Absolute that is irreducible to the accepted beliefs and behaviors of any human community. It would not be too difficult to distinguish Socrates and Abraham as representatives of two different species of this genus. Connell's warning against thinking too easily in terms of genus and species structure is well taken, however, given the fact that the religions of Socrates and Abraham differ in form and not just in content, appealing, respectively, to recollection and revelation, and that in general, for Kierkegaard, immanent religion is sine qua non for transcendent religion. One species is not usually a necessary condition for another. Kierkegaard's point, of course, is that one must at least be in the genus (defined above) where Socrates is to be found, if one is to claim to be a Christian. One can't hit a home run while playing hockey.

This becomes the emphasis in Postscript, and Connell appropriately emphasizes the change in Socrates' role from Fragments to Postscript. In the former he is linked to Plato's doctrine of recollection and thus of the possibility of religion within the limits of reason alone. Kierkegaard's concern is sharply to distinguish any such move from Christianity. But in Postscript Socrates becomes a hero as a species of the genus, just discussed, that belongs to the definition of religion. For Socrates understood, while much if not most of Christendom does not, that the religious task is to be absolutely related to the Absolute (the divine) and only relatively related to the relative (any human community). In rejecting the absoluteness of Athens, not just in theory but in action, he is akin to Abraham, for whom the divine command trumped the ethical universal, the nation, the state, society, the church, and the sect.

Connell concludes chapter four with a discussion of my own concept of Religiousness C in Kierkegaard. If Jesus is the paradox to be believed in Religiousness B (over against the immanent religion of Religiousness A), in religiousness C he is the paradigm or the pattern to be imitated. The task of becoming a Christian involves not only orthodox beliefs but also a Christlike life. He rightly notes that the implication of this concept for the issue of religious diversity depends on which of two possible readings are given to it. I leave it to the reader to decide whether this is a useful concept for understanding Kierkegaard and what to do with it, if anything, in our present context.

In his final chapter Connell turns to what Quinn called the issue of "constructive comparison," drawing on his own extensive knowledge of the Confucian traditions. He admits that at first glance such a comparison would seem to emphasize the radical difference between Kierkegaard's emphasis on the individual and the Confucian emphasis on community. But he finds "a surprising degree of common ground between the two, especially on the issue of ethical selfhood," noting that Kierkegaard gives at least four different meanings to 'the ethical' (pp. 153-54).

Like Kierkegaard, Confucius does not equate the good life with the laws and customs of any society or culture just because it is my own lifeworld. And while Confucius rejects the ideal of universal love (the non-preferential love of Works of Love), his ethic is clearly one of other-oriented duty.

More significant are the convergences Connell finds in two other places, the ethical as understood by Judge William in Either/Or and as understood by Climacus in Concluding Unscientific Postscript. Both emphasize an inwardness irreducible to consequentialist analysis. In a "broadly Aristotlean" manner they develop an ethic of "self-actualization or soul-making" (p. 159). The task is to become oneself and this is a task one is obliged to choose. Put this way, Connell is able to develop significant parallels in Confucius.

When it comes, however, to the religious dimension of ethical life, it is necessary first to note the difference between the moral self-confidence (I would say complacency) of Judge William and Climacus' sense of the self's deep inadequacy before an infinite task, like the difference between the two brothers in the parable of the prodigal son. To whom is Confucius closer? Surprisingly, perhaps, Connell finds crucial texts that point in each direction, but on the whole he finds Confucius closer to Judge William. At least as important as this particular judgment is the fact that in the face of acknowledged unlikelihood Connell has been able to develop illuminating comparisons between Kierkegaard and Confucius. His creative use of Quinn's fourfold scheme provides fresh ways of reading Kierkegaard.