Kierkegaard and the Theology of the Nineteenth Century: The Paradox and the 'Point of Contact'

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George Pattison, Kierkegaard and the Theology of the Nineteenth Century: The Paradox and the 'Point of Contact', Cambridge University Press, 2012, 240pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107018617.

Reviewed by Jeffery Kinlaw, McMurray University


This book will be controversial. Pattison is convinced that at least a general outline of a coherent and distinct theology can be reconstructed from Kierkegaard's work provided that one allows the discourses -- in Pattison's view, as one should -- to illuminate one's reading of the pseudonymous works. Pattison follows precisely this strategy. Adherents of more radically ironist readings of the pseudonymous works and of indirect communication will be suspicious -- perhaps at best -- from the start. And Pattison eschews debates about pseudonymous authorship, since engaging them would be a distraction (and correctly so) from the central argument of his book. This particular controversy is, in this instance, however, itself a distraction, and accordingly I will not challenge Pattison's reading of Kierkegaard's pseudonymous authorship (I also disclose that I am sympathetic, for the most part, with his approach to the pseudonymous works).

Pattison has two basic aims: (1) to situate the young Kierkegaard in the context of (mostly Danish) theological debates of mid-nineteenth century and show how Kierkegaard's theological position emerged from and was adumbrated by his early engagement and dissatisfaction with speculative theology, or right-wing Hegelianism, and (2) to reconstruct the basic structure of the theological position that defines Kierkegaard's mature work from the 1840s (that is, up to and including The Sickness Unto Death). Pattison's primary contribution, in my judgment, is his development and defense of (2). What emerges is a far more nuanced theological position than has been assumed traditionally. This position is intimated in the book's subtitle. The expression "point of contact" is associated most familiarly with the historic Barth-Brunner debate over the effects of the Fall. Emil Brunner had argued that knowledge of God's revelation or appropriation of God's grace presupposes, despite the Fall, at least a minimum capacity of human receptivity for God's self-revelation or God's gift of grace. In short, genuine human receptivity requires a rudimentary continuity or commensurability between divine and human, again, even after the Fall -- thus the reference to a point of contact. Karl Barth dissented and argued in strict Calvinist fashion that human reception of revelation and/or grace was itself a component or moment within God's act of disclosure or redemption (thus Barth's repeated claim in the Church Dogmatics II, 2 that knowledge of God is God's knowledge of Godself).

This issue, to be sure, has obvious implications for Christian freedom, and Pattison confronts it directly. Kierkegaard's most consistent and best considered view, he argues, is one in which redemption preserves a legitimate sense of libertarian (as it turns out) freedom even though redemption is a radical re-creation ex nihilo of the self. Furthermore, humans have an actual capacity for self-transcendence and thus an inherent openness to God's self-showing, even though Kierkegaard is a theological realist and takes the content of all revelation to be a divine gift. Put in theological terms, Kierkegaard's theology exhibits neither stark paradox nor an unalloyed point of contact between nature and grace.

The book can be organized into three distinct sections. The first three chapters unpack Kierkegaard's initial encounter with speculative theology, as evidenced in his student notes, and indicate the theological themes and commitments that adumbrate his mature theology. Chapters four through seven reconstruct what Pattison takes to be Kierkegaard's mature theology; chapter four is the pivotal chapter. Chapters eight and nine confront the issue of communication, that is, how "proclamation" of Kierkegaard's theological position arose from his study of contemporary Danish homiletical theory and thus his confrontation with Danish ecclesiastical culture that highlights the final years of his life. Pattison argues that there is more theological continuity than tension between Kierkegaard's mature period (1840s) and the pessimism of his later work in the 1850s. A brief, concluding chapter provides a summary defense and vindication of (2).

Chapter one begins with Kierkegaard's initial encounter with Schleiermacher and argues surprisingly that the latter contributed positively and formatively to Kierkegaard's incipient case against speculative theology, surprising since Schleiermacher's religious epistemology has been construed, far more often than not (though incorrectly), as an immanence theory. What is fascinating, however, is that Kierkegaard astutely (and correctly) discerned that the feeling of absolute dependence (for the Christian) is always modified by the recognition of the need for redemption and is thereby directed to Christ (meaning that knowledge of God for the Christian is Christocentric and soteriological). This means that whereas an analysis of self-consciousness can disclose that one is utterly dependent on a "Whence" of one's active and passive existence, the recognition of content of that Whence as God requires the special gift of divine revelation. As Pattison stresses, the initial source of Kierkegaard's more nuanced view of the "God-relation" is his original reading of Schleiermacher's Glaubenslehre: we indeed have the capacity for self-transcendence, but true identity of the "Other" toward which we attempt to direct ourselves must be graciously revealed by God. Schleiermacher also provides Kierkegaard, according to Pattison, with the valuable lesson that becomes central to the latter's account of freedom and redemption, namely, that (a) humans need redemption and are capable of receiving it, meaning that (b) we are capable (post Fall) of freely responding to divine grace.

This is a splendid opening chapter, though I have one notable objection. In several places, Pattison appears to claim that Schleiermacher's religious epistemology is non-cognitive and then takes this approvingly to mean that one's relation to Christ is strictly soteriological. The latter is true, whereas the former is decidedly false (and one doesn't need the former to affirm that latter) unless one equates cognitive with noetic in the strictly right-Hegelian sense that of course is different from Schleiermacher's view. This seems to be what Pattison has in mind, and thus better clarity would have been helpful particularly in relation to Schleiermacher. Importantly, though, Pattison situates a commitment to (again presumably) libertarian freedom at the beginning of Kierkegaard's career and thereby constructs the initial basis for dissociating Kierkegaard from traditional Augustinian-Lutheran models of redemption.

Chapters two and three are developed primarily from student notes, sometimes with unnecessarily painstaking detail, with the aim of indicating continuity between notes and subsequently published material. Chapter two assesses Kierkegaard's reactions to Johann Eduard Erdmann's and Hans Lassen Martensen's lectures, while chapter three unpacks Schleiermacher's encounter with David Strauss (primarily mediated by Julius Schaller). Kierkegaard's objections are targeted to two central claims: that the content of Christian faith is exhaustively mediated by historical experience and that that experience can be fully articulated in the form of objective knowledge. As Pattison emphasizes, such reductive accounts of Christian experience fail to make even minimal sense of the phenomenology of redemption, namely, that redemption is a new creation and that faith experience is that of a new consciousness that isn't circumscribable within the boundaries of consciousness discernible entirely apart from faith. In sum, speculative theology lacks a coherent theory of salvation. Kierkegaard's argument, as Pattison reconstructs it, is based on a skeptical premise whose significance Pattison doesn't fully appreciate and which is important for evaluating Kierkegaard's account of the "God-relationship" Pattison analyzes in the pivotal chapter four.

Chapter four explicates the structure of the God-relation. Pattison argues convincingly that Kierkegaard's theology is grounded in a fundamental interrelation between what Pattison calls a theology of redemption and a theology of creation. The interrelation is as follows: redemption is a restoration and fulfillment of what was originally intrinsic to the God-relationship and one's utter dependence on God. The God-relation is part of the structure of, and thus immanent within, self-consciousness, but the intentional object of that relation is a radically transcendent God known only within God's restorative act of redemption. Nonetheless, the redeemed Christian is a new creation restored ex nihilo as a repetition of the original creative act. This means that there is an ontological and functional continuity between the created self and the redeemed self in the sense that "redemption is essentially and ontologically conformable to the structures of thinking, self-conscious human life," and a theology of redemption thus can "legitimately incorporate and internalize a theology of creation" (89). Needless to say, this is a serious departure from the theological determinism of the early Luther while remaining a distinctly Protestant theology. A serious commitment to human freedom, as Pattison stresses, motivates Kierkegaard's position. The grace of redemption is a gift, but we have the capacity to respond freely to that gift. Although becoming a new creation requires that one stand before God as nothing -- as a self-emptied sinner who can offer only trust and love -- standing before God as nothing in love partially enables the reception of grace and the new creation.

One serious omission is any serious analysis of Kierkegaard's conception of freedom. Pattison argues in chapter one that Kierkegaard was preoccupied with the basic problem of the compatibility between divine omnipotence and human freedom and had a guardedly positive reaction to Schleiermacher's effort to combine the feeling of absolute dependence with one's capacity to respond to divine grace. Schleiermacher, however, was a classical compatibilist, whereas Pattison's Kierkegaard (accurately) is a libertarian. Recall that one retains after the Fall the capacity to accept or reject God's gratuitous gift of redemption. Kierkegaard's libertarian view of free will, to be sure, partly underwrites his commitment to the continuity between nature and grace, creation and redemption -- thus the point of contact rather than sheer paradox. An at least brief explication of Kierkegaard's view of free will would have been helpful.

Kierkegaard develops his theology in reaction to and partly as a critique of immanence theories of the God-relation typified by the so-called speculative theology of his day. As I mentioned above, his argument turns, as Pattison seems to acknowledge, on a skeptical premise. Kierkegaard concedes that immanence theories can disclose an unspecifiable "Other" transcending self-consciousness and the human species. Immanence theories, however, cannot establish in a non-question-begging way that (α) one is utterly dependent on this Other, and that (β) this Other is God. The argument supporting these conclusions turns on the premise that existence cannot be proven, which appears to be based (as Pattison seems to intimate in passing in chapters two and three) on a tension between consciousness and reality. One direction the argument could take would be a Schellingean critique of Hegel's ontological argument, roughly summarized: Hegel's effort to argue not only for the existence of God but for the elevation of consciousness, in the ontological argument, to knowledge of God, is vulnerable to concept instantiation skepticism (the failure to secure God's existence would block elevation of consciousness).

After all, Kierkegaard attended Schelling's lectures in Berlin and was undoubtedly influenced by what he heard. Kierkegaard, though, doesn't need this skeptical premise to sustain (α) or (β), and it would undermine his own concession to immanence theories, namely, that they partly succeed in establishing that there is something that transcends consciousness and the human species. The actual premise driving Kierkegaard's argument, a premise Pattison should consider more seriously, is Kierkegaard's commitment to theological realism (which he also would have heard Schelling defend in his Berlin lectures). God is strongly transcendent in an ontological and epistemological sense. Immanence theories cannot connect self-transcendence and God, since that connection requires God's own self-disclosure. Kierkegaard's theological realism can be seen to underlie Kierkegaard's claim in The Concept of Anxiety that, as Pattison notes, psychological analyses (e.g., of anxiety) cannot generate concepts and forms of thinking appropriate for dealing with a transcendent reality such as a sinful relation to God, although they can offer a preliminary orientation toward transcendent divine reality. And this captures Kierkegaard's concession to, along with his critique of, immanence theories.

Chapters five through seven further develop components of Kierkegaard's theology whose foundation was so well explicated in chapter four. Chapter five extends the discussion of the theology of creation by reference to Kierkegaard's reflections, repeated throughout his work, on the lilies and birds in the Sermon on the Mount whose natural and unqualified acceptance of their sheer dependence on God is a model for Christian devotion. Again, the God-relation is one of utter dependence, though one that must be freely chosen. Chapter six covers Kierkegaard's view of sin. Two points are salient: sin does not block one's capacity to choose freely a relation of absolute dependence, and despair (synonymous with the Fall) is actually a form of weakness even when defiant, namely, the weakness of being unwilling to be who one is as utterly dependent on God and who God wants one to be. Chapter seven discusses Kierkegaard's view of redemption by reference to his emphasis on the sinful woman of Luke 7. For Kierkegaard, redemption is modeled on the self-abandoned love and openness to transcendence the woman expresses. Her self-abandonment makes her self-transparent to reflect God's love and glory by choosing to appropriate her dependence on God. Accordingly, love enables faith -- again a departure from Luther and the Augsburg Confession.

Chapters eight and nine, the final substantive ones, concern respectively the literary and ecclesiastical culture Kierkegaard found as hostile to the communication of authentic Christian faith. In chapter eight Pattison discusses the homoletical theory of Bishop Jacob Mynster and N. F. S. Grundtvig, both critics of inclinations to sublate the actual language and meaning of biblical texts toward the communication of mere objective knowledge. Pattison argues that their influence helped Kierkegaard develop a writing style by which the reader is inspired to confront her own existence and her own relation to God.

Chapter nine transitions from the contemporary Danish "book culture" to Danish ecclesiastical culture and the role of tradition in Christian faith. Pattison had stressed in early chapters that the tradition of faith commitment, rather than reason, was, for Kierkegaard the Christian a priori for theological reflection. Of course, by tradition Kierkegaard means the history of individual commitments of faith and not the institutional Church. But this chapter concerns primarily Pattison's effort to defend continuity in Kierkegaard's theology from his mature literary output of the 1840s to the pessimism displayed in the works of the 1850s that coincided with his more caustic critique of the Danish Lutheran Church. This argument for continuity rests on the following basis: Kierkegaard, despite his growing pessimism about earthly existence, rejected all forms of apocalypticism -- in sum, there is only one world. The question is how one lives her life in this world, a life which, whether described affirmatively as blessed or lamented as one of suffering, should be seen and lived as an expression of divine love. As Pattison reminds us, Kierkegaard's commitment to a unitary view of the world places him more in the tradition of Schleiermacher and Rudolf Bultmann than of Luther.

Despite some objections, I recommend Pattison's addition to the ever expanding literature on Kierkegaard and on nineteenth century theology, a body of scholarship to which Pattison has contributed significantly. He makes a compelling case for what I take to be his central claim, namely, that one can construct from Kierkegaard's discourses and pseudonymous works a carefully nuanced theological vision.