Kierkegaard, Communication, and Virtue: Authorship as Edification

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Mark A. Tietjen, Kierkegaard, Communication, and Virtue: Authorship as Edification, Indiana University Press, 2013, 156pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253008626.

Reviewed by Sharon Krishek, The Hebrew University of Jerusalem


Mark A. Tietjen's book makes an important contribution towards clarifying a debatable issue, which is pivotal to the interpretation of Kierkegaard's writing, namely: how should one evaluate the diversity of voices and other literary devices characteristic of Kierkegaard's method of 'indirect communication'? Tietjen suggests what he calls a 'hermeneutic of trust' as a way of approaching the heterogeneity that characterizes Kierkegaard's philosophy. In contrast to aesthetic or psychological readings of Kierkegaard's philosophy, which emphasize either Kierkegaard's literary style or his colourful personality (respectively), Tietjen offers the kind of approach that encourages us to put the emphasis where it rightly belongs: on Kierkegaard's philosophical ideas.

To someone unfamiliar with Kierkegaard's corpus, the need to argue for such an approach may sound a little strange: is it not the natural and obvious thing to do when reading a philosophical text? However, in the case of Kierkegaard's philosophy, the answer, regretfully, is 'not always'. His aforementioned method of 'indirect communication' -- namely, his use of pseudonyms, the playfulness of his writing, the irony and humour often employed by his fictional characters -- may shift the reader's attention away from the content of his ideas to the way he chooses to shape and convey them. The obvious danger entangled in such an approach is the marginalization (or at least the under-prioritization) of interesting and valuable philosophical ideas. But more than that, given that such a shift of focus frequently accompanies the assumption that there is no coherent philosophical intention motivating Kierkegaard's manner of writing, the real danger is the possible failure to take Kierkegaard's words  seriously. And here lies one of the great merits of Tietjen's book. He makes a strong case for taking Kierkegaard's words, all of Kierkegaard's words -- those delivered directly (in the signed works) and those delivered indirectly (in the pseudonymous works) -- seriously.

Taking Kierkegaard's words seriously paves the way for Tietjen's threefold thesis. (1) Kierkegaard is an edifying author: his intention is to "[assist] his reader to grow in faith, or love, or courage, or to question whether one's commitments in life contribute to a whole, flourishing, self" (p. 4). That is to say, Kierkegaard has a moral and religious intention to help his reader to attain the good life, and this intention informs every piece of his writing. (2) Kierkegaard's ultimate edifying message is primarily Christian, that is, Kierkegaard believes that the way to attain the good life is to become a Christian (in the special way he understands what Christianity means). Being an edifying author, he tries to open his reader's eyes to the significance of Christianity. (3) Taking Kierkegaard seriously (that is, as an edifying author whose message is a Christian one) entails accepting Christianity as the highest and truest way of life. In other words, to be ultimately (and not only partly) edified by Kierkegaard is to become a Christian. The first two aspects of Tietjen's thesis are explicit; the third is implicit. And while I think that Tietjen is justified in contending (1) and (2), I think that he is unjustified in inferring, even if only implicitly, (3). I will return to this reservation below, after shortly presenting a summary of Tietjen's book, a summary that will also serve to sketch his central move.

Apart from the introduction and conclusion, the book is divided into three parts composed of seven chapters. The first part, "Jest and/or Earnestness", introduces an effective criticism of Roger Poole's deconstructive reading of Kierkegaard. Poole uses the label 'blunt reading' to describe the attempt to read Kierkegaard's authorship as conveying a clear, unified and coherent philosophical message (that is, more specifically, the attempt to read him as an edifying author). This kind of reading, according to Poole, enforces seriousness on Kierkegaard's texts by ignoring the implications of his use of pseudonyms and his employment of irony, humour and other literary techniques (p. 21). However, Tietjen's response is to demonstrate that an earnest reading of Kierkegaard (one that takes him to be an edifying philosopher) need not be a 'blunt' one: one can be as sensitive and attentive to Kierkegaard's indirectness as Poole justly demands, and read Kierkegaard earnestly. On the contrary, being thus sensitive actually confirms an earnest reading of Kierkegaard. To give only one example, offering an alternative to Poole's reading of the pseudonymous Fear and Trembling, Tietjen exemplifies how understanding "the pseudonym as a character in the text" (namely, not reading the text bluntly) "functions as a device of edification" (p. 27). In contrast to Poole's deconstructive way of understanding Kierkegaard's indirectness, Tietjen, relying on Kierkegaard's unpublished lectures on communication, introduces the idea of 'communication of capability'. This idea suggests that indirectness is used because "the ethical is not something to be taught as an object of knowledge but to be evoked as a capability" (p. 55).

The second part, "Suspicion or Trust", focuses on Kierkegaard's retrospective writings collected under the title The Point of View. In these works, Kierkegaard explicitly presents himself as an edifying author, which clearly supports Tietjen's thesis. However, to make his case stronger, Tietjen needs to respond to well-known criticisms of Kierkegaard's retrospective writing by interpreters like Henning Fenger and Joakim Garff, who question the reliability of Kierkegaard's self-testimony. Both interpreters assess the retrospective writing specifically, and Kierkegaard's authorship more generally, from a psychological perspective: rather than seeking coherence in Kierkegaard's thought, they try to establish coherence in Kierkegaard's personality. Tietjen demonstrates the problems entailed in such an approach, and as an alternative to the "hermeneutic of suspicion found in Fenger and Garff" he offers a "hermeneutic of trust" (p. 75). Such an approach to reading Kierkegaard, he claims, is both productive and moral: it engages the reader in a real dialogue with Kierkegaard, making him or her really open to what Kierkegaard has to say.

Having demonstrated the validity and strength of an approach that trusts Kierkegaard's words and takes them seriously, in the third part, "Faith and Virtue", Tietjen applies this approach to reading Kierkegaard's pseudonymous treatment of the concept of faith. While presenting the various ways of understanding this concept as developed by the different pseudonyms, he highlights the dialogue and continuity among these different points of view. Such a broad and inclusive exploration of the concept of faith reveals its richness and profundity and, to borrow the metaphor of a diamond which Tietjen makes use of in a slightly different context, it effectively shows the multi-faceted nature of faith: "Just as a diamond has multiple facets and each facet looks a certain way from a certain angle, so do ethical concepts have multiple facets that appear in greater richness and complexity when they are approached dialectically" (p. 131). Thus, presenting the 'diamond-like' shape that the exploration of faith takes when one listens with earnestness and trust to Kierkegaard's pseudonymous and non-pseudonymous words alike is valuable for two reasons. First, independently of the subject of edification, it sheds light on Kierkegaard's overall understanding of faith. Second, and more importantly from the point of view of the subject at hand, it gives textual evidence supporting Tietjen's claim that Kierkegaard is best understood as an edifying author who has a clear (though complicated) philosophical thesis to convey that runs through all of his writings.

The concluding chapter can be read as a kind of appendix to the central project or as the starting point for a new one. Assuming that at this stage of the book we can safely consider Kierkegaard to be an edifying author (and to restate, I think that Tietjen gives us strong reason to so consider him), Tietjen wishes to place Kierkegaard in the "Western virtue tradition" that includes historical figures like Plato, Aristotle and Kant on the one hand, and recent figures like Elizabeth Anscombe and Alasdair MacIntyre on the other (p. 117). However, even if there are good reasons to consider Kierkegaard a virtue ethicist as Tietjen claims (a thesis that other recent Kierkegaard scholars also advance), I would not so easily join him in his "lobbying for an end to the days where Kierkegaard is read by college students as . . . the father of existentialism" (p. 118). Although there is no doubt that from an ethical point of view "Kierkegaard has more in common with Aristotle than he does with Camus or Sartre" (p. 120), he nevertheless shares essential concerns with the latter thinkers that justly earned him the title 'the father of existentialism'. To disregard that due to essential differences between Kierkegaard and later existentialists is, to use the cliché, to throw out the baby with the bathwater.

But this is a matter for a different debate. To focus on the central issue of the book, edification, let me conclude by returning to my assessment of Tietjen's threefold thesis stated at the beginning of this review. Tietjen's explicit goal is to present Kierkegaard as (1) an edifying author, and more specifically (2) an edifying author whose "edification has as its end becoming a Christian" (p. 90). Presenting Kierkegaard in this way obviously puts weight on Kierkegaard's intention, so Tietjen also wishes to demonstrate that "the question of what Kierkegaard intends is not trivial for one's interpretation and understanding of Kierkegaard" (p. 4). In my view, Tietjen is successful both in showing that Kierkegaard's intention is relevant to reading his philosophy (because, contrary to deconstructive reading, it encourages us to take his words seriously), and in specifying the nature of his intention (to edify his readers towards Christianity). However, Tietjen goes further and implies that (3) given Kierkegaard's intention, to be edified by Kierkegaard is to become a Christian. And here I disagree: one should be careful not to confuse Kierkegaard's intention with philosophical reasoning. That is to say, one can take Kierkegaard's words very seriously and accept that Kierkegaard's intention is to edify, leading the reader towards a Christian way of life, but this in itself is not enough for the reader to be convinced that she should become a Christian.

To put it differently, accepting that Kierkegaard's ultimate message is the superiority of Christianity does not of course entail accepting that the message is true. In order for this to happen, one needs to be convinced that the message is a valid one, and here, obviously, Kierkegaard's intention is no longer relevant. From a philosophical point of view (where one judges according to criteria such as coherence, consistency, the ability to shed light on one's experience and so on), maybe Kierkegaard's words in, say, Fear and Trembling or The Concept of Anxiety will prove to be more convincing despite not conveying the exact Christian message that reflects Kierkegaard's intention. Tietjen does not specifically claim the contrary, but implicitly it seems that he does. However, if we are convinced by Tietjen's thesis that we should take all of Kierkegaard's words seriously (and, as I already said, I think that Tietjen gives us good reason to be thus convinced), does that not open the door precisely to the possibility that Kierkegaard's words will persuade us to accept a message that does not necessarily reflect his intention?