Kierkegaard on Ethics and Religion: From Either/Or to Philosophical Fragments

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W. Glenn Kirkconnell, Kierkegaard on Ethics and Religion: From Either/Or to Philosophical Fragments, Continuum, 2008, 177pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781847060785.

Reviewed by Anthony Rudd, St. Olaf College


This book is an attempt to read Kierkegaard's early pseudonymous writings in the light of his early (non-pseudonymous) Upbuilding Discourses, and vice versa. Kirkconnell notes in his brief introductory chapter that we tend either to read only the pseudonymous works or to read them and the Discourses separately from one another. But, he notes, "Kierkegaard imagined an ideal reader who would divine the works were related and would compare the two series to one another … noting the contrasts and convergences between them." (2) So he proposes, as a hermeneutical experiment, that we should read these works in the order in which they were written, looking for connections between the signed and the pseudonymous works. And, he concludes: "This experiment does indeed yield interesting results." (146) Kirkconnell argues that his approach brings out the religious agenda underlying even what seem to be largely secular works such as Either/Or and Repetition, and shows the development of an increasingly rigorous religious outlook, from Judge William's accommodating inclusion of the religious within an autonomous, humanistic ethics in Either/Or to the radical Lutheran emphasis on human sinfulness and the need for grace in the Fragments.

Chapter Two starts the experiment with a reading of Either/Or and the 'Two Upbuilding Discourses' that were published a few months later, but which were, according to Kierkegaard, intended to accompany it. Kirkconnell argues that, although there is an obvious validity to the traditional view of Either/Or as "prereligious" (3) dealing as it does with a confrontation between the aesthetic and the ethical spheres, we should also be alive to the possibility of reading the book as an (indirect) "religious polemic." (3) As he points out, in the Denmark of Kierkegaard's time the cultured elite tended to think of religion either in Romantic terms, as a matter of mood and intuition, best expressed by the poetic genius; or in Kantian terms, as largely a backdrop to an essentially ethical outlook. Either/Or shows the limitations of both the poetic and the ethical approaches to life and, by extension, to religion, thus clearing the ground for a deeper understanding of the religious and its relation to human possibilities. Kirkconnell notes that "A", the aesthetic author of Part One of Either/Or, makes quite frequent and "relatively orthodox" references to "the theological currents of his day" and also claims (more contentiously) that A "seems … to genuinely believe that there is a God." (10) But despite that, A's vague Romantic pagan-Christian religiosity is shown to be far removed from authentic Christianity. Judge William, in Part Two of Either/Or, develops an ethical philosophy in which the religious "provides a foundation and a buttress for the goals and strivings of the ethical", but Kirkconnell claims, "his conceptions of sin and grace are in some ways even more ill-defined than A's." (28) In fact, William rejects even Kant's secularised version of the Christian idea of sin -- the notion of radical evil -- thus making him both more complacent and further from orthodoxy than Kant was. (31) Hence William is seriously challenged by the sermon ('Ultimatum') that concludes Either/Or and which develops the thought that, as against God, we are always in the wrong. In this context, Kirkconnell then goes on to argue, we can see Kierkegaard's first two 'Upbuilding Discourses' as starting from, but also starting to move away from, the essentially humanistic religious consciousness expressed by Judge William.

Chapter Three considers the three books that were all published on the same day in October 1843 -- Fear and Trembling, Repetition and Three Upbuilding Discourses. Kirkconnell sees all three works as carrying on the discussion of the relation between the religious and the ethical from where Either/Or and its accompanying Discourses left off. He starts with Repetition, giving a very helpful commentary on what is possibly Kierkegaard's most enigmatic text, teasing out the commonalities and differences between the various meanings that repetition can have in aesthetic, ethical and religious contexts. Kirkconnell keys this discussion to the question already starting to emerge from Either/Or: how do those who have, deliberately or not, placed themselves in the wrong ethically, return to an ethical existence? The suggestion that this question forces a new either/or on us -- a choice between a reversion to the aesthetic or a more seriously religious understanding of sin, grace and atonement -- is further developed with respect to Fear and Trembling. Kirkconnell takes an unusual approach to this most widely read of Kierkegaard's texts, focusing on the short introductory section, 'Exordium', in which four versions of the story of Abraham and Isaac, differing in varying ways from the Biblical original, are told. Kirkconnell's exegesis of these scenarios is intended to show "Abraham's faith … to be a unity of esthetic, ethical and religious elements, each of which is essential." (66) But he also argues that comparison with the contemporaneous Discourses suggests that Fear and Trembling "has a hidden agenda (namely the problem of sin) which is even more central to Kierkegaard's actual concerns than the text itself indicates." (68) While the first two Discourses "offered a religion largely of comfort, barely moving beyond the ethical" the Three Upbuilding Discourses of October 16th 1843 "present a religion of paradox, trial, absurdity, consonant with the themes raised in Fear and Trembling and Repetition." (71) The recognition of our inability to live the moral life through our own power of choice precipitates, on this view, the breakdown of the ethical as a self-enclosed sphere and drives us either to despair or to a more deeply religious way of thinking.

Chapter Four, 'The Nine-Discourse Bridge', discusses the three sets of Discourses that Kierkegaard published in between the appearance of Fear and Trembling and Repetition, and that of Philosophical Fragments in June 1844. These are said to "serve as a bridge between the earlier pseudonymous works and the Climacus writings", the latter of which deal with explicitly Christian concepts. (77) They are, moreover, said to "depict how the esthetic and ethical elements are dethroned, yet preserved and integrated, within a religious life." (Ib) Several themes running through these nine Discourses are chosen for detailed discussion: the importance (both positive and negative) of doubt, uncertainty and anxiety in the religious life; Kierkegaard's emphasis on questions of character and virtue, rather than on moral rules; his particular concern for more 'passive' virtues, such as humility and patience; his stress on essential human equality together with his rejection of political and economic egalitarianism; and his emphasis on sin and the need for grace. The chapter also includes an interesting interlude discussing the influence of Luther on Kierkegaard, both directly and via Hamman. "Far more than the pseudonyms, Kierkegaard's Discourses reflect the concepts and concerns of Luther and Lutheran theology." (91) However, while they emphasize sin and the need for grace, these Discourses still shy away from discussing the specifically Christian doctrine of the Incarnation. According to Kirkconnell, though, they pave the way for this to be picked up on as the central theme in the Fragments.

The Fifth and final Chapter thus focuses on Philosophical Fragments, which Kirkconnell sees as a response to the questions raised by the whole authorship preceding it.

[T]he two tracks of the authorship have come by different routes to the same point. The pseudonymous works have arrived at the concept of sin both as the necessary completion of ethics and its self-refutation. The direct discourses arrive at 'sin' … as the necessary recognition by the religious person of his or her own limits … What both suggest is that some drastic divine action is needed if sin is to be overcome. (108)

The Fragments discusses, though in an ironically "hypothetical" style, the possibility of some such divine action, while also developing an even more radical account of sin, as a state of being totally outside and indeed hostile towards the truth. Kirkconnell gives a careful reading of the earlier and later chapters of the book (though not the central chapter on the Absolute Paradox, or the important 'Interlude') tracing in particular their implications for ethics. The Fragments he sees as completing the progress away from the humanistic autonomy-based ethics of Either/Or to a radical Lutheran perspective:

The immediate ethical implication of Climacus' project, then, is to radically qualify the essential ethical assumptions that one can know or choose oneself or recognize or approach the good, as [Judge] William claims. Prior to being taught by the god, all striving is simply further development in sin. (119)

Nonetheless, Kirkconnell still sees the progress through the earlier stages as a sort of necessary pedagogy: "to achieve faith, the learner must first achieve as much self-knowledge as Socrates showed." (120) As with Either/Or, he stresses the particular historical context of the Fragments, as a polemic against those of Kierkegaard's contemporaries who tried to rationalise Christianity, while also usefully insisting that the point of the book is not to revel in its irrationality either. (137-40) A brief Conclusion summarises the argument of the book, emphasizing the way in which sin emerges as the dominant theme of the authorship, and pointing the way to further developments.

The book is written in a clear and lively style and is well-organised. It focuses very much on detailed exegesis of its chosen texts; there is little engagement with secondary literature, and what there is is largely confined to endnotes. There is also little criticism of these texts; Kirkconnell's concern is to understand, rather than assess them. And, although he emphasises the importance of reading Kierkegaard in his historical context, this context is sketched in quite briefly; there is no attempt at detailed historical scholarship. Nor are there more than very fleeting references to works by Kierkegaard other than those selected for detailed commentary. I don't mean any of these remarks as criticisms; they merely draw attention to the kind of book Kirkconnell has chosen to write. His readings of the works he does discuss combine careful attention to detail with a sense of their place in the overall progression that he wants to trace. They could certainly be helpful to students approaching these works for the first time, but they should also be of interest to more advanced scholars.

One could raise various questions about Kirkconnell's approach. Though he doesn't commit to supposing that Kierkegaard had the whole plan of the authorship worked out from the start, he does present himself as trying to "give us a more accurate view of what Kierkegaard really thought, if anyone cares about authorial intent in this postmodern age." (2) Those who don't may be dissatisfied, especially those who like to stress the "specificity" of the pseudonyms, and discourage reading them as stages in a single authorially intended argument. My sympathies are with Kirkconnell here, and I'm happy for him to simply approach Kierkegaard in his own way, without getting into preliminary methodological fights; but the less sympathetic reader is warned. One might also raise questions about the choice of texts. There is no mention of Kierkegaard's dissertation, The Concept of Irony, though it is quite important for understanding the subsequent authorship. (Despite Kierkegaard's own rather disparaging later remarks about it.) But much more puzzling is the omission of any discussion of the Concept of Anxiety. It was published only four days later than the Fragments, so it clearly fits within Kirkconnell's chosen timeframe, and it is centrally concerned with the issue of sin (original sin, the Fall). This makes it a sort of companion-piece to the Fragments, and surely crucial for fully understanding the thematic development that Kirkconnell is concerned to trace. And, given the emphasis on interweaving discussion of pseudonymous and signed works, it's a shame that Kirkconnell also doesn't mention the final set of Four Upbuilding Discourses from August 1844, which does in a sense round out this portion of Kierkegaard's authorship. These omissions do, I think, actually weaken the case that Kirkconnell makes for his overall reading.

Finally, what of that reading? I think there is no doubt that Kirkconnell has traced out one important strand of thought running through Kierkegaard's early authorship. There isn't much that is explicitly said about sin and the need for grace in Either/Or, Repetition or Fear and Trembling, but it is interesting to see them presented as indirectly guiding the reader to the point where the "non-Socratic" hypothesis of the Fragments will at least seem intelligible as an option. I don't think Kirkconnell would claim that his is the only way to read these works. In discussing Either/Or he says he is not contradicting the traditional reading of the work, but offering a supplemental understanding of it as an indirect religious polemic. (3) He is clearly selective in the aspects of the texts that he attends to. As noted above, even in discussing the Fragments, he has little to say about its epistemological aspects, or the "absolute paradox." Although Kirkconnell's reading of Fear and Trembling (the best-known work that he discusses in Kierkegaard on Ethics and Religion) is ingenious and interesting, it is a bit oblique and focuses mostly on only a small part of the text. Here Kirkconnell's reading depends especially on his method of understanding the pseudonymous works in the light of the Discourses, since the problem of sin as such is not (as he indeed notes -- 68) a very major explicit theme of Fear and Trembling or Repetition. (Abraham is not presented as a sinner, and neither the Young Man of Repetition nor the story's cynical narrator sees the breaking of the Young Man's engagement as sinful.) It is, however, very interesting to see Kierkegaard's early work read as a whole in the way Kirkconnell suggests, and, given the relative paucity of philosophical writing about the Discourses, his clear and insightful commentary on them is a valuable contribution.