Kierkegaard on Faith and Love

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Sharon Krishek, Kierkegaard on Faith and Love, Cambridge UP, 2009, 201pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521519410.

Reviewed by M. Jamie Ferreira, University of Virginia



Krishek’s general aims in this bold book are to show that Kierkegaard’s normative revisioning of the concept of religious faith entails a normative revisioning of the concept of love, and that Kierkegaard’s project in Works of Love fails to do justice to his best insights about love. In particular, Krishek argues that the model of faith in “two movements” found in Johannes de Silentio’s Fear and Trembling is a necessary corrective to the model of love found in Works of Love. This entails a re-examination of both works, prefaced by a re-consideration of the ways in which Kierkegaard’s various presentations of love raise issues about loss and resignation. The re-examinations of Fear and Trembling and Works of Love can be judged independently — that is, the success of her argument about Fear and Trembling does not depend on the success of her argument about Works of Love. Moreover, whether or not her boldest challenge to Works of Love is convincing, her analysis makes illuminating distinctions and in the process introduces the reader to the most recent scholarship on Works of Love. For these reasons, the book is worthwhile reading for any Kierkegaard student or scholar.

To an academic audience chastened over the decades by warnings not to put all the writing done by Søren A. Kierkegaard into one melting pot (but to distinguish clearly between pseudonymous writings and signed writings), Krishek’s attempt to illuminate and amend one of Kierkegaard’s signed religious texts (Works of Love) by reference to an earlier pseudonymous text (Fear and Trembling), and to show “how two of Kierkegaard’s most noticeable voices, when joined together, create a clear and interesting ensemble” is provocative (141). Her justification is, I think rightly, that “the core of some of Kierkegaard’s most important ideas can be traced back to his pseudonymous writings, and in some cases their expression in these writings is particularly lucid and illuminating” (141). In other words, Krishek usefully reminds us not to overlook the continuity, repetition, and complementarity in Kierkegaard’s works.

Krishek’s boldest move is to suggest what she calls a confusion, contradiction, or inconsistency in Works of Love. She structures her discussion in an interesting, if unexpected way: on the opening page of the book she uses as an epigraph one of Kierkegaard’s most appreciative comments on erotic love (namely, “erotic love is undeniably life’s most beautiful happiness” (WL 267), but her goal is to show that Kierkegaard’s stark contrast between preferential love (erotic love and friendship) and non-preferential love (neighbor-love) entails that preferential love is necessarily selfish, and, therefore, inconsistent with his apparent appreciation of preferential love. She suggests an irresolvable tension within Works of Love between Kierkegaard’s desire to warn against selfishness and his desire to affirm our concrete createdness, concluding that a flawed account of romantic love issues from his failure to appreciate the possibility of unselfish preferential love.

Prior to mounting her challenge to Works of Love, and giving the impulse for it, Krishek re-examines the spectrum of interpretations of Fear and Trembling. Her normative reading is not the first to take the emphasis in Fear and Trembling away from the suspension of the ethical and turn it to faith in God’s promise to Abraham, to claim that the test in Fear and Trembling is not a test of invalidating the ethical, but of trusting God’s promise for “this life”, or to suggest that the question of the relation between Fear and Trembling and Works of Love be shifted so that we are not just seeing them as successive attempts to deal with divine command, but rather as more complex forays into the nature of ethico-religious faith. Krishek’s study is, however, the most fulsome elaboration of that strategy.

Whereas the focus on suspension of the ethical leads one to emphasize the renunciation dimension, the focus on faith reveals the importance of the second movement of faith — the renewed joy in the finite. Krishek argues against making Abraham’s self-denial or resignation central, suggesting instead that faith is distinctive because it goes beyond resignation to an affirmation of the self’s interests in the finite. Krishek goes beyond other commentators in taking the model of faith in Fear and Trembling and construing it as a model of love that can be fruitfully compared with the model of love in Works of Love. In so doing, she forces us to think about the connection between the portrayal of resignation in Fear and Trembling and the portrayal of self-denial in Works of Love. In sum, the question is no longer whether the ethics in Fear and Trembling is Kierkegaard’s ethics, or whether it is superseded in Works of Love; the question is whether certain insights found in Fear and Trembling can be lasting ones, incorporated into Kierkegaard’s later explorations of love.

Before addressing in detail the book’s challenge to Works of Love, let me highlight what I take to be Krishek’s original contribution to the discussion of Fear and Trembling. She is arguing that the story of Abraham is everyone’s story insofar as any love we have is threatened by loss of the beloved; the lesson to be learned is that the relation to what is thereby taken away (at least potentially or essentially) must be renewed as a joyful celebration of what is essentially threatened. She writes that the knight of resignation is not “heir to the finite” in the way that the knight of faith is because he

may ‘get the princess,’ but he cannot find joy and hope in the relationship with her. Having resigned he has ‘full insight into the impossibility of their future happiness’ and he lacks the ability to trust the givenness and renewal of that which is constantly (and essentially) being taken away from him,

whereas the knight of faith

can receive her back every moment anew, and affirm their relationship while at the same time renouncing her and denying himself (189).

Love and life are always only receiving back ever anew.

Krishek takes from Fear and Trembling de Silentio’s insight about the movement of receiving back (repetition) and proposes that the structure of faith is also the normative structure of love. She further proposes that romantic love instantiates in a remarkable way precisely the importance of this second movement, the movement of taking joy in what is constantly being re-given to us (because the security of the relationship is essentially always being taken from us).

Krishek’s main project is to rehabilitate the notion of “romantic love”, rescuing it from Kierkegaard’s mistake. This is important because it raises undeniably important questions about whether and when self-love is ‘selfish’. She aims to show both that romantic love should be celebrated, whereas Works of Love fails to do that, and at the same time that, in Kierkegaard’s corrected philosophy we see that “love — and in particular romantic love” — has a “similar centrality” to that of faith (189). My major reservation about Krishek’s project has to do with the criticism of Works of Love — in particular, it is unclear what the status of the criticism is. At times it seems that Krishek is uncovering an inconsistency in Works of Love; at other times, it seems that she is suggesting an inadequacy. In the first case, her work would be put forth as a corrective of Works of Love (admittedly informed by Kierkegaard’s own better insights in Fear and Trembling), while in the second case it would serve as a complement to Works of Love’s inadequate presentation of romantic love. In the first case, her charge would be that Works of Love contains an irresolvable tension; in the second case, her charge would be that Works of Love contains a lop-sided emphasis on self-denial.

Let me summarize her argument. Her main criticism is that Works of Love “does not allow equality and preference to coincide” because it “insists on structuring the model of love in terms of self-denial and non-preferentiality”; the consequence is that Kierkegaard requires "one and the same equal love for all" — the problem is that we have to love all “in the same way (in the neighbourly, non-preferential, equal way)” (124). The problem is brought to a head, not just by Kierkegaard’s contrast between preferential love [Forkjerlihed] (erotic love and friendship) and non-preferential love [Kjerlihed] (neighbor-love, equal love), alongside his restriction of preferential love to forms of self-love, but by his additional (and mistaken) assumption that the drives and inclinations (by implication, the concrete embodiedness) that distinguish preferential love are necessarily selfish and therefore a form of “improper” or “selfish” self-love. That is, admitting that Kierkegaard allows for “proper self-love”, she nonetheless faults him for failing to have a broad enough notion of proper self-love to include preferential loves (116). She concisely formulates the dilemma she finds in Works of Love: “how can I love my romantic beloved (assuming that this is a love that is by definition preferential) by virtue of a love which is essentially and decisively non-preferential” (124). Such a formulation attributes a logical inconsistency or contradiction to Kierkegaard — namely, Kierkegaard defines love paradigmatically in terms of non-preferentiality and therefore precludes preferential loves from being genuine instances of love.

Krishek, however, often also seems to suggest that Works of Love is incomplete — that is, that Kierkegaard allows that preference is not necessarily selfish, but he does not “joyfully celebrate” the implications of our finite embodiedness (our needs, drives, inclinations) (128). She writes that he “tolerates” them but only grudgingly, unenthusiastically, apologetically; the broader notion of proper self-love that she advocates is not “ruled out”, but self-denial is the “dominant structure” (116-117). The vacillation in her charge can be found within a single sentence, as when Krishek writes that that "in Works of Love Kierkegaard seems to be quite oblivious to the second movement — the movement of affirmation — and to focus on the movement of resignation … alone" (130, my emphases). My fear is that Krishek’s attribution of “an ambivalence” to Kierkegaard has muddied her own criticism; her charge should be clearer — either there is an irresolvable tension within the book that excludes the appropriate affirmation of finitude and preference or it is a question of focus or emphasis (116). If Kierkegaard does not rule out the possibility that preferential love can be unselfish (a kind of proper self-love), then he can consistently maintain an appreciation of this possibility.

If, on the other hand, she is trying to address the inadequate way in which Kierkegaard treats “romantic love” in Works of Love, it should be noted that Works of Love is not a book about romantic love — the focus is on neighbor love. It is true that Kierkegaard does not elaborate a model of romantic love in the way he elaborates a model of neighbor love. And in this respect, Krishek’s book is a major accomplishment — it elaborates a model of romantic love that can be self-interested without being selfish. But Kierkegaard never rules this out. Krishek enlarges by elaboration (rather than by adding a new category) the model of proper self-love already found in Kierkegaard. True, Kierkegaard is much more concerned to emphasize the self-denial in all love — the depictions of the selfishness possible in our relationships with others are always more graphic than the depictions of unselfishness. But possibilities are not necessities, and Kierkegaard does not claim that they are.

Krishek wants an “unapologetic” celebration of our finitude, of the sort that is suggested by the notion of the “second movement” of faith in Fear and Trembling, a receiving of the finite with joy. In fact, there is a celebration of the finite, and in particular of preferential loves, in Works of Love: Kierkegaard not only insists that “erotic love is undeniably life’s most beautiful happiness and friendship the greatest temporal good” (as Krishek herself admits), he also says that “erotic love and earthly love are the joy of life” and issue in “delight” (WL 267, 250). This sounds celebratory. Unfortunately, Krishek concludes that this kind of celebration is inconsistent with Kierkegaard ‘s commitments concerning the selfishness of preferential loves. But if Krishek admits, as she does, that Kierkegaard “tolerates” such expressions of our need and drives, it follows that Kierkegaard does not see them as necessarily selfish. Kierkegaard doesn’t “tolerate” selfishness — he wants it rooted out.

While Krishek is eminently fair to the commentators she examines, she seems to ignore the fact that the text of Works of Love provides a number of critical affirmations of our drives and inclinations and needs, places where Kierkegaard tries to correct a negative “misunderstanding” about our drives and inclinations; he rules out a misplaced ‘either/or’ (WL 44, 52-53; 143-44). Moreover, Kierkegaard ‘s comments about self-love need to be taken in context — in the context of his claim that Christianity’s “misgivings about erotic love and friendship” concern preferential love that expresses “selfishness”, we can read his remark that “self-love is reprehensible” as referring to selfish self-love, not self-love as such (WL 52-3, 57). Kierkegaard often expects the context to make clear which kind of self-love he is referring to. Finally, according to Kierkegaard, “our Lord Jesus Christ, even he humanly felt this need to love and be loved by an individual human being”; Christ’s “craving to hear” that Peter loved him “more than these” is paradigmatic of human love: “to love humanly is to love an individual human being and to wish to be that individual human being’s best beloved” (WL 155, 156). If preference implies that we want to be loved by the one we love, or be considered a friend by the one we consider a friend, or that we desire intimacy with either beloved or friend, or that we want to be the source of the other’s good, this does not seem in Kierkegaard’s eyes to entail selfishness (something morally negative). In addition to celebrating our human need to love and to be loved as a distinctive individual, I would argue that the movement of affirmation is embedded in Works of Love in a variety of other commitments Kierkegaard holds: e.g., “one who loves receives what he gives” and “I myself receive what I give to another”, and other forms of the crucial “like for like” (WL 281, 376).

Krishek reminds us that the word "Kjerlihed" is indeed used by Kierkegaard to refer to the source of love planted in us by God as well as to “neighbor-love”. But the charge that Kierkegaard “identif[ies]” them is unfounded (134). This is clear from Kierkegaard ‘s directive that we "in erotic love and friendship, preserve love for the neighbor [Kjerlihed]" (WL 62). The goal is to “preserve” the second in the first, not to annihilate the distinctive character of the first. Erotic love must remain erotic; it is not replaced or excluded by neighbor-love. In fact, one could say that Krishek’s book nicely elaborates the preferential character of the first part of that directive (“in erotic love”), while Kierkegaard elaborates the non-preferential character of the second part (“neighbor-love”).