Kierkegaard on Self, Ethics, and Religion: Purity or Despair

Kierkegaard On Self Ethics And Religion

Roe Fremstedal, Kierkegaard on Self, Ethics, and Religion: Purity or Despair, Cambridge University Press, 2022, 280pp., $99.99 (hbk) ISBN 9781316513767.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Hanson, Harvard University


Some of the most interesting and important scholarly work on Kierkegaard is playing out in conversation with contemporary problems frequently discussed in analytic philosophy. Roe Fremstedal’s Kierkegaard on Self, Ethics, and Religion is a valuable contribution to this trend. His book is not merely an exegetical undertaking but a constructive engagement with debates in moral psychology, ethics, and personal identity. In keeping with the emerging consensus, Fremstedal argues that the implications of Kierkegaard’s work go well beyond the limits of Christian theology. The book is structured in four parts that are well-integrated despite concerning a range of topics and problems. Fremstedal’s exposition is anchored in his understanding of Kierkegaard’s philosophical anthropology. The role played by despair in this anthropology serves as the basis for multiple lines of argument concerning ethics and the relationship of ethics to religion, which Fremstedal reads in a novel manner as fortifying one another rather than being in conflict (as such). In his opening chapters Fremstedal musters a number of effective arguments against amoralism and in favor of a non-eudaimonist reading of moral motivation. A complex and innovative interpretation in his middle chapters shows how Kierkegaard reconciles an ethical investment in the “highest good” with a genuinely other-regarding morality. By positioning Kierkegaard between Christian virtue ethics and Kantianism, Fremstedal is able to navigate further thorny problems linking ethics and religion. In these middle chapters Fremstedal confronts some of Kierkegaard’s most provocative and controversial ideas like the “teleological suspension of the ethical” and the notorious claim that “truth is subjectivity.” The final chapters explicitly tackle the relationship of faith and reason (though here again Kierkegaard himself does not usually invoke these terms in the same way that contemporary debates are conducted, though this material is entirely timely and relevant to contemporary debates).

The introductory material is perhaps the least innovative, but Fremstedal is on solid ground and right that the rest of the book, which is increasingly creative, rests on this conceptual foundation. His emphasis on wholeheartedness is important both for the arguments that follow and for fitting Kierkegaard’s work into analytic conversations about personal identity and the ethical issues that follow from this starting point. Among Fremstedal’s more significant achievements are his sustained placement of Kierkegaard’s work in relation to Kant’s; his thorough shoring-up of Kierkegaard against charges of fideism; and his unique reading of an obscure reply Kierkegaard made to a critic, Magnús Eiríksson. To my knowledge this material has not been explored with the same amount of detailed attention anywhere else. Fremstedal it seems to me lands on the correct conclusions throughout the book: Kierkegaard is not a fideist but a suprarationalist; he is not a pure eudaimonist, but his ethics is situated “somewhere between Christian virtue ethics and Kantianism; (92)” ultimately for Kierkegaard, religion and ethics are not in conflict. In many cases Fremstedal is providing the argumentative scaffolding necessary to support intuitions that sympathetic readers of Kierkegaard are likely to hope are true but lack the command of the texts and the analytic precision to ground. Fremstedal himself is refreshingly forthright in his book about the modesty of his own conclusions, which he recaps at the end of each of his chapters, and the areas where more research is called for. In that spirit, in what remains of this review I will simply point out some areas that in my view call for further specificity. In most instances my suggestions do not undercut Fremstedal’s arguments but are rather intended to clarify and indeed strengthen them.

Fremstedal’s case that Kierkegaard’s account of subjectivity requires a commitment to nonarbitrary standards of normative value is impressive. Contrary to some contentions in the secondary literature that for the Dane any “life-project” will serve the purpose of integrating selfhood in an essential way, Fremstedal shows that not just any aim will successfully integrate the self. On the contrary, a robust morality will necessarily be part of any such integration. Interacting with a number of interlocutors, Fremstedal consolidates a considerable body of commentary around the argument that Kierkegaard presents rational justifications for agents to be moral on pain of slipping into despair, which he reads as a form of incoherent or internally divided agency. 

Fremstedal himself concedes that there are technical limitations to Kierkegaard’s critique of eudaimonism, some of them stemming from what would appear to be simply an absence of distinctions in his intellectual context, distinctions that are familiar to Anglophone philosophers today (90). These debates are extremely subtle, but I found myself wondering whether Fremstedal’s early association of Kierkegaard with the heritage of Christian Platonism might have been clarifying had it been brought back into this conversation. Kant looms large here as throughout, but a reading of Plato as holding to what has been called the “ecstatic” character of reason might be a better pairing for his purposes here. Here I am following D. C. Schindler, who argues that for Plato “To say that reason is ecstatic means that its proper end lies in a fundamental way outside of itself, which is another way of saying that there is something intrinsically rational about what is ‘suprarational’ (note here the exact coincidence of terminology between Schindler and Fremstedal’s attribution of this descriptor to Kierkegaard’s view).[1] On this understanding of Plato, reason comes to claim, as it proceeds outside itself, territory that at first seems opposed to the domain of logos; at its highest reach it comes to enclose within itself a reclaimed mythos, imagery, and the body and its sensible powers. A holistic conception of this sort might enrich Kant’s antinomic construal of reason and its limits. A comparable case could be made about the persistence of self-love within love when it comes to morality. My own view on this is that self-love is the starting point for love in Kierkegaard’s moral psychology, but at its end point one comes to realize that loving the neighbor just is what is most self-loving as it makes the self richer and more expansive than it would be were it to remain stranded in its own egotism.

When Kierkegaard writes things like “To will the good is indeed the most sagacious thing—yet not as understood by sagacity but as understood by the good” (cited by Fremstedal, 86) I take it this is what he means. Calculating sagacity turns out to be right about its own good, but only when it realizes, contrary to its initial egocentric impulse, that its own good is attainable only by promotion of the good of others. Such a progression I think is legible in the text of The Republic, and the parallel case about self-love and love is also implied by Philosophical Fragments (in a passage also analyzed by Fremstedal, 46) and detectable as well in Works of Love.

Again this is an admittedly complex point, and the distinctions can become quite intricate, but it seems worth getting it nailed down as precisely as possible. If there is any point in the arguments of the central chapters that needs further clarification, it is in my view the need for more dialectical specificity. Fremstedal refers to Kierkegaard’s distinction between “first” and “second” ethics, but again it seems to me more could be drawn out here to help clarify the two. It is not always plain to me whether the distinction is being adhered to in Fremstedal’s discussion. I take it from the Introduction to The Concept of Anxiety that the central issue is that first ethics for Kierkegaard is a humanly constructed ideal imposed “top-down” as it were on the facts of human nature, while second ethics is a revelation-informed “bottom-up” revised ideal that builds on the facts of fallen human nature. First ethics takes it that virtue can be realized, in line with the noble aspirations of the ancient Greeks; second ethics knows that this is false, we have all sinned and fallen short of the glory of God. First ethics is only capable of pronouncing against misbehavior and judging it accordingly; second ethics is redemptive, offering forgiveness for failure and a way to live forward into a hopeful future.[2]

Fremstedal sometimes lumps the two together (or seems to): For example,

Kant and Kierkegaard both dismiss the eudaimonistic idea that morality can be justified prudentially. Both assume conflict between morality and prudence, which ethical eudaimonism denies. Indeed, Kierkegaard’s critique of eudaimonism is difficult to reconcile with most forms of virtue ethics since the latter normally presupposes ethical eudaimonism. Kierkegaard’s (first and second) ethics therefore come closest to Kantian-idealistic ethics that breaks with eudaimonism, hedonism, and consequentialism. (91)

Here the differences to which I have sketchily referred would not map so easily on Fremstedal’s terrain. Similarly on the next page he claims:

It therefore seems best to consider Kierkegaard’s ethics to lie somewhere between Christian virtue ethics and Kantianism. I think that this holds for both the first and second ethics, although Kierkegaard’s last writings emphasize Christian suffering and martyrdom in a manner that goes beyond non-Christian (‘first’) ethics. (92)

It is the case that “first” ethics is non-Christian, but that doesn’t leave out (for Kierkegaard) only suffering and martyrdom as ethically important concepts. As I have argued elsewhere, more conciliatory moral phenomena like love of enemy and forgiveness of sin might belong to second ethics, which would thereby enrich and elaborate upon first ethics with respect to both form and content. Where exactly to draw the dividing line, and what sorts of ethico-religious realities get allocated to which side of that dividing line, are perhaps matters for ongoing debate (Hanson 2017). 

Fremstedal is on firmer ground, it seems to me, when he writes things like, “The ‘teleological suspension’ cannot possibly negate ethics, since it represents the second ethics” (125). Here of course he is engaging with the notoriously thorny issues at the heart of Fear and Trembling. It is perhaps inevitable that any interpretation of this provocative text will err to one side or another: Either one emphasizes the trauma and horror of what would appear to be religious extremism and the violence it is bound to precipitate or one emphasizes the reconciliation and relief of disaster averted and ethics restored.[3] Fremstedal focuses us on the second and softens the first; if anything though, he could derive even further support for his rationalistic reading of religion in this text from within the text itself. I think there are good reasons to suppose that Abraham here is not meant to be the final exemplar of faith but that the many humane portraits of love under strain that follow in Problema III are meant to be more plausible and relatable to the reader. Furthermore, there are many passages within Problema II that point to the thesis that faith does not overthrow ethics but redeems a limited form of ethics (“first ethics”). We should keep in mind too that the constant target of Johannes de silentio’s critique is “the ethical as universal,” which certainly does not seem to be the whole of ethics.

Clarity about first and second ethics is desirable when it comes to the arguments about the relationship of reason and faith, ethics, and religion. Here too attention to the dialectical subtleties is needed. At one point, Fremstedal writes that “Christianity, by contrast, starts not from our desire to possess the ‘highest good,’ but from imitation of Christ and loving the neighbor for his own sake. Its starting point is therefore Christocentric and other-regarding, not anthropocentric or self-regarding” (97). It depends, I think, on what we mean by a “starting point.” Dialectically, and as a matter of our own development as moral agents, no one starts with an other-regarding outlook but a self-regarding one, an outlook that we learn by progress to higher levels of self-consciousness about ourselves standing before God and in relation with others that develops into an other-regarding one, though again at the highest pitch it seems to me that other-regard presents itself as the necessary companion to an elevated and morally chastened self-regard after all.

 While it is true that “Like Kant, Kierkegaard then distinguishes sharply between morality and selfishness and between freedom (or spirit) and nature, respectively. Like Kant, he classifies nonmoral motives as selfish” (83), one could argue that these conclusions are not the outcome of a priori reasoning for Kierkegaard but lived experience in attaining higher levels of selfhood, sin-consciousness, and the recognition of the incumbency upon me of moral obligation. On some views, for Kierkegaard spirit awakens from nature, emerges from it, in a dynamic process. So while spirit is distinct from nature, it also depends upon it (and the unfolding of human history) in a more dialectically complex relationship. Without nature there is no vehicle for the spirit to express itself, just as language is impossible without a body (see Hall 1981). For Kierkegaard then, as I understand him, there are simply more bumps in the proverbial road between where we start and where we end up on the itinerary of selfhood.

Ultimately Fremstedal is correct that for Kierkegaard Christianity is concerned with more than ethics (129). Exactly how Christianity ends up expressing itself in terms of second ethics, or the stage of faith, or neighbor-love, or the “ethico-religious” of Johannes Climacus (and in the case of this term I am tempted to think that what Climacus calls “ethical” is just not the same thing as what de silentio (for instance) calls the ethical as universal, adding terminological complexity to the discussion) is highly complicated. Fremstedal does an excellent job of unraveling these complications, but I remain convinced from the above considerations that Christianity is not reducible to morality for Kierkegaard as I think it is for Kant (though Fremstedal contends otherwise (108)). Fremstedal is largely right that the religious for Kierkegaard encompasses a new expanded ethics that relates to first ethics, but there are many discontinuities and detours along the way. Kierkegaard is a holistic thinker, but the journey to wholeness in lived truth is a fraught one, with many leaps and risks. Perhaps this is more a matter of emphasis than substance, as Fremstedal certainly is aware of the intricacies that attend his project. In the end, this book is a substantial contribution to the project of sympathetically and systematically reading Kierkegaard’s authorship in fruitful dialogue with issues of considerable contemporary relevance and import.


D. C. Schindler, Plato’s Critique of Impure Reason: On Goodness and Truth in the Republic, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press, (2008).

Jeffrey Hanson, Kierkegaard and the Life of Faith: The Aesthetic, the Ethical, and the Religious in Fear and Trembling, Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, (2017).

Kevin Hoffman, “Facing Threats to Earthly Felicity: A Reading of Kierkegaard’s Fear and Trembling,” Journal of Religious Ethics 34.3, (2006): 439–459.

Reidar Thomte in collaboration with Albert B. Anderson (eds. and trans.), The Concept of Anxiety: A Simple Psychologically Orienting Deliberation on the Dogmatic Issue of Hereditary Sin, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, (1980).

Ronald L Hall “The Origin of Alienation: Some Kierkegaardian Reflections on Merleau-Ponty’s Phenomenology of the Body,” International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 12.2 (1981): 111–122.


[1] Schindler (2008), 322. The whole coda to this book is worth reading for a detailed analysis of the view I am arguing could be illuminating for understanding Kierkegaard as a Christian Platonist.

[2] See the elaborate Introduction to The Concept of Anxiety: A Simple Psychologically Orienting Deliberation on the Dogmatic Issue of Hereditary Sin, ed. and tr. Reidar Thomte in collaboration with Albert B. Anderson (1980).

[3] This observation was astutely made by Kevin Hoffman (2006)