Kierkegaard's Concept of Faith

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Merold Westphal, Kierkegaard's Concept of Faith, Eerdmans, 2014, 284pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780802868060.

Reviewed by Sharon Krishek, The Hebrew University of Jerusalem


Reading Merold Westphal's new book is like taking an insightful tour along the manifold paths that compose the landscape of Kierkegaardian faith. Kierkegaard, as is well-known, wrote many of his essays pseudonymously, adopting not only different names but also different personas, each exemplifying a unique style and a distinct point of view. Accordingly, while it is never a simple task to account adequately for a philosopher's view, in the case of Kierkegaard a further complication is added due to the fact that major themes of his philosophy are often addressed from various perspectives and accordingly are given very different accounts. One of the prominent merits of Westphal's book is that it elegantly brings together some of Kierkegaard's different voices and incorporates them into a coherent, clear-sighted account of faith.

Focusing on five essays with three pseudonyms, who are nicely linked by their names -- Johannes de Silentio, Johannes Climacus, and Anti-Climacus -- Westphal presents a comprehensive picture that connects the different aspects of Kierkegaard's polyphonic discussion of faith. At the core of the picture is this idea, beautiful in its simplicity: for Kierkegaard, faith is first and foremost a personal relationship with a personal God (Westphal often refers to faith in this sense as 'biblical faith').

Westphal explores the significant implications of having such a 'biblical faith' by presenting twelve aspects, or theses, of faith. Through a discussion of Fear and Trembling we learn that faith is a "task for a lifetime", that it expresses "trust in divine promises" and is "obedience to God's commands". We also learn that it is a "teleological suspension of reason" and "the highest passion". Through a discussion of Philosophical Fragments and Concluding Unscientific Postscript to Philosophical Fragments we learn that faith is a "reception of revelation", a "happy passion that overcomes offense", and "a passionate appropriation of an objective uncertainty". We are told that faith is "a leap and a striving" and, more specifically, that it is "a striving pathos that goes against reason". Finally, through a discussion of The Sickness unto Death and Practice in Christianity we learn of faith as "willing to be oneself -- before God" and as "contemporaneity with Christ -- without offense". All these aspects together make an interesting and nuanced picture of faith, which clearly makes the book rich in ways that I cannot begin to adequately discuss here. In what follows, however, I do want to look more closely at three of the noted twelve aspects of faith.

While Westphal admits that his account is not exhaustive (p. 274), we can assume that his choice of these specific twelve theses indicates that he considers them especially important, and central to Kierkegaard's understanding of faith. However, what I find missing in Westphal's otherwise comprehensive account is a thirteenth thesis, which may be called 'faith as an affirmative relationship with the world'. This thesis can be found between the lines of some of the other theses, but is not made sufficiently explicit. It seems to me that the recognition of this further thesis can have a significant impact on our understanding of Kierkegaard's conception of faith. The three theses I shall focus on are those that seem to me best at pointing to the missing 'thirteenth' one:

(1) Faith as trust in divine promises (Chapter 2)

(2) Faith as obedience to divine commands (Chapter 3)

(3) Faith as willing to be oneself -- before God (Chapter 12)

Westphal presents theses (1) and (2) in his discussion of Fear and Trembling. He claims that Johannes de Silentio makes two important distinctions, each of which illustrates one of the theses. The distinction between the knight of infinite resignation and the knight of faith demonstrates the first thesis, while that between the knight of faith and the tragic hero demonstrates the second.

Resignation is the position of one who, having found it impossible to get hold of some X in the world, accepts that X is not, and will never be, a part of his or her life. Westphal delineates "a fourfold difference" between this position and faith (p. 33). While (a) "Resignation is the end of hope, the loss of a future", for the knight of faith "The promise of God keeps hope alive. Abraham still has a future" (p. 33). Accordingly, (b) while "the knight of infinite resignation relates to . . . God only in eternity, only when . . . he has emptied himself of everything temporal", Abraham's faith "was not just that he would get Isaac back but that somehow he would get Isaac back in time, in this life" (p. 34). Hence, (c) the "most fundamental difference" is that "The two knights serve two very different gods" (p. 36). While "the God of faith is an agent and a speaker in this world, in time. . . . We hear nothing of such agency from the essentially deist God of infinite resignation. . . . This God is too remote to keep promises and too impersonal to make them in the first place" (p. 36). And this brings us to (d) "infinite resignation is a natural human capacity while faith is not" (p. 37). Accordingly, Westphal claims, "It looks as if the deist God of the former is, strategically speaking, an attempt to remain religious while retaining the autonomy with which modernity had become so enamored" (p. 37).

Westphal rightly emphasizes the difference between the two positions. The second movement of faith is distinct from the first, resignation, and it is indeed trust in God's promises that marks the crucial difference between them. However, while this entails (a) and (b), it does not necessarily entail (c) and (d). Westphal does not seem to give enough weight to faith's dependence on resignation. The two positions are not merely two separate options of religiosity; the relation between them is closer than that. After all, faith is defined by Johannes de Silentio as a double movement of resignation and faith, which means that resignation is an integral part of faith. That is, to carry out the movement of faith is eo ipso to carry out the movement of resignation.

To put it more accurately, then, the difference is between a person with resignation alone, and a person with both resignation and faith. The lad who is a knight of resignation renounces his princess and "stops" with this, but Abraham goes further: he both renounces Isaac and has trust in Isaac's "return". Accordingly, infinite resignation cannot imply a different God from that which faith implies, because infinite resignation is a part of faith, and whatever is implied by a part of faith is in particular implied by the whole of it. Thus the two knights cannot "serve two different gods": they serve the same God, but while the first knight has a limited, less developed relationship with Him, the latter has a full, correct one.

Here the thirteenth, "missing", thesis comes to the fore. Trust in God's promises (and indeed trust in God more generally) is exemplified and expresses itself in the context of one's relationship with the world. This is the medium through which the highest degree of relationship with God takes shape. Thus, in addition to (a) and (b), what really distinguishes the knight of resignation from the knight of faith is the failure of the former to do what the latter astonishingly does: affirming one's relationship with the world while simultaneously renouncing it. The failure of the former knight is based on his inability to trust God rather than on having a different concept of Him (c) or nourishing an arrogant sense of autonomy (d). The knight of resignation, no less than the knight of faith, accepts his deep inability to have control over his life; this is precisely what resignation is about. The knight acknowledges that he is unable to get a hold on what he mostly desires -- the princess, for example, or Isaac -- and such an acknowledgment of his limitedness cannot by any means reflect a sense of autonomy. Thus, in renouncing his control, the knight of resignation acknowledges his dependence on God and obeys God's will. This takes us directly to the second thesis of faith: obedience to divine commands.

Westphal is undoubtedly right to claim that this thesis is a crucial characterization of faith. However, the idea was put forward earlier by Johannes de Silentio in his analysis of faith as a double movement. Resignation, being a profound and wholehearted acceptance of God's will (which is naturally distinct from, and maybe even contrary to, one's own), is obedience to God's commands. A textual grounding of this idea is provided at the beginning of Fear and Trembling, where four imagined Abrahams are presented to illustrate failed versions of faith. All four are about to sacrifice Isaac -- namely, they are all obeying God's command -- and yet they are not knights of faith. Moreover, Westphal claims that obedience to God's commands is exemplified by the difference between the knight of faith and the tragic hero. This is because, even though the latter also sacrifices his child, he does this, unlike the former, for a goal that is accepted and respected by society. However, this difference holds true as well when we compare the tragic hero with the knight of resignation: the four "failed" Abrahams, unlike the tragic hero, and despite not being knights of faith (bur only of resignation), cannot justify their sacrifice in social terms any more than the knight of faith can.

Thus, I think that when Westphal claims that it is a mistake to consider the "preliminary" analysis of faith to be the core of Fear and Trembling (see pp. 37, 69, 76),[1] he does not pay enough attention to the role of resignation in faith. Westphal is indeed correct to say that the second thesis of faith receives more focus in discussions of the contrast between the tragic hero and the knight of faith. However, this contrast presents neither a new theme nor a new paradox (see pp. 41-42). Rather, it is an elaboration of the same theme that was presented before in the "preliminary" analysis of the double movement of faith. And it also presents the same paradox, the one entailed in sustaining two seemingly opposite positions at the same time: affirmation of the relationship with Isaac by doing what seems to be an extreme violation of it.

The point is that resignation can take many forms, in accordance with the will of God, to which it responds. And obedience to God's demands should not necessarily oppose the demands of society. Thus, it is clear that the specific manifestation of resignation through sacrifice is not essential to faith (one can be a knight of faith, and thus obey God's commands with resignation, without being required to sacrifice one's son). What is essential to faith is obedience to God's will -- whatever form it takes -- and this essential condition is already present in the "preliminary" analysis of faith.

Finally, turning to The Sickness unto Death, Westphal presents the third (or, in his book, eleventh) thesis of faith: willing to be oneself -- before God. This is not a typical way of thinking about faith, as he rightly says (p. 236), and he should be praised both for his clear discussion of one of Kierkegaard's more complicated essays and showing the value of considering faith in this way. Westphal explains how defining the self as "(A) a relation [between the finite and the infinite, the temporal and the eternal, necessity and freedom] that (B) relates itself to itself and (C) in doing so relates itself to another" (pp. 236-237) establishes the essential connection between a person and God.

To be "a relation" means that a human is an "individual to which both sets of predicates apply, however different they may be from each other" (p. 237), which indicates that a human being is equally (and intriguingly) related to the realm of finitude as well as to that which transcends this realm. Namely, one is both the "facticity" that defines one and the ability to transcend that facticity -- by relating to a power different from one's own. Hence we need (B) and (C). To be "a relation that relates to itself" indicates the activity of the self who understands itself as a relation and acts accordingly, thus forming itself. However, by definition the self is not free to be whoever it wishes to be: it has to do this in relation to another. Accordingly, the self is always interrelated with a power that transcends and influences it.

Westphal helpfully elaborates on how this complicated self-formation constitutes faith, but he apparently overlooks the essential role that the world -- and thus the human other -- plays in this relational definition of self (and, accordingly, of faith). He says: "To be sure, here in Sickness the self is related (or misrelated) to itself; but it is also essentially related (or misrelated) to God. And in Works of Love the self is essentially related to the neighbor, the human other" (p. 245). However, we do not need Works of Love to learn that the self is essentially related to the human other; this is already entailed in the analysis of the self in The Sickness unto Death. Positing 'finitude', 'necessity', and 'temporality' as integral to the structure of selfhood, and claiming explicitly that to be a self one has to relate to another (while leaving open the possibility that 'another' does not refer only to God), we find 'the world' (and thereby the human other) as an essential mediator (or, to use Kierkegaard's concept, 'middle term') between the believer and God.[2] And so we are back to the thirteenth thesis: faith as an affirmative relationship with the world.

Obviously, this brief discussion of only three of the twelve aspects of faith presented by Westphal does not do justice to his rich and enlightening study. However, I hope that it succeeds in reflecting the book's strengths. Westphal's decision to posit 'biblical faith' as the beating heart of Kierkegaard's view is a compelling way to think about what faith means for Kierkegaard. It serves as a way to focus the discussion of a huge topic, and to guide the reading of essays packed with difficult and perplexing ideas. And it offers a beautiful way to synthesize the different accounts of faith that we find in Kierkegaard's writings. The result of viewing Kierkegaard's diverse characterizations of faith as so many aspects of the central idea of having a relationship with a personal God is insightful and exciting. This is an important contribution to the way we should think about Kierkegaardian faith.

[1] Full disclosure: This is Westphal's main criticism of some readings of the essay, including my own.

[2] Clearly, more needs to be said. For an elaboration and justification of this claim see my "The moral implications of Kierkegaard's analysis of despair", Religious Studies, available at CJO 2014 doi:10.1017/S0034412514000511.