Kierkegaard's Concluding Unscientific Postscript: A Critical Guide

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Rick Anthony Furtak (ed.), Kierkegaard's Concluding Unscientific Postscript: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 258pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521897983.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Hanson, Australian Catholic University


One of the most noteworthy features of Kierkegaard’s Concluding Unscientific Postscript: A Critical Guide is that it lives up to its subtitle. This collection truly is a guide to the work as a whole. That it serves as such is no small achievement, and it is surely a credit to the editor, Rick Anthony Furtak, that he kept the contributors from niggling with details that could have only limited interest to the most specialized scholar of (Kierkegaard’s pseudonym) Johannes Climacus’ writings. The dozen essays collected here (none penned by a Dane, interestingly) speak to the largest themes of this notoriously difficult and overlong work and stay admirably focused on what the reader needs to keep in mind very generally to come to grips with the text. None of these essays is narrowly focused on any minor issue or local question; instead each one concerns a major point, generally one that has implications for understanding the Postscript as a whole or even more broadly, the Climacan authorship. In what follows I touch on some of the essays that resonated most powerfully on my reading, in part doubtless because they speak to my own interests in the text. Inability to address all of them does not imply any criticism of those that space demands I omit.

The first contribution from M. Jamie Ferreira seeks to situate the Postscript in relation to the Crumbs (as it is consistently referred to in this book, though the more familiar translation is "Fragments"), the work to which it is appended as postscript, surely not without whimsical irony however, as has been noted before, given that Climacus’ putative “postscript” is many times longer than the supposed “body” of the Crumbs. Ferreira parses the differences between what Kierkegaard could have meant by a postscript and a sequel, especially since through Climacus’ voice he seemed both to affirm and deny that the Postscript was a sequel at all. Ferreira contends that in order to make sense of the discrepancy one must read the Postscript as containing "both a quasi-sequel to the Crumbs (which elaborated some claims effectively made in Crumbs) and a postscript to Crumbs that provided a new and crucial supplement to Crumbs." (7) She goes on to argue that while Part One serves as a sort of sequel providing a refinement of key notions from the earlier work, it is the far longer Part Two that is the true postscript and in effect puts forward something new, namely, “a more appreciative take on Socratic subjectivity” and beyond that a "presentation of Socratic subjectivity as a necessary preliminary to genuine Christianity," effectuating thereby a much more “positive relation” (7) between the Socratic and the Christian than is implied by the either/or dichotomy presented by the Crumbs. A useful discussion could be enacted between her thesis and Merold Westphal’s Becoming a Self, which is perhaps the most developed extant discussion on the relationship between Climacus’ use of Socrates as a foil in the Crumbs and his conspicuously more unreservedly appreciative treatment in the Postscript.

The second two contributions do focus on more specific textual issues than many of the others, but again each has a direct bearing on the interpretation of the work as a whole. Alastair Hannay’s “Johannes Climacus’ revocation” is centered on the shocking assertion by Climacus, submitted quite late in the text, that the book’s contents are to be regarded by the reader as superfluous and to stand as “revoked.” Hannay surveys the critical literature on what this cryptic and seemingly counterproductive remark could possibly mean and turns to an account of Climacus’ humor to clarify.

Edward F. Mooney’s essay, “From the garden of the dead: Climacus on interpersonal inwardness,” also seems to be about a particular slice of text, a brief interlude that Climacus recounts as explanation for his vocation as a writer: while sitting in a cemetery Climacus overhears a grandfather cautioning his grandson about the errors of the latter’s dead father, who was lured away from the path of faith by the enticements of reflection, and this incident prompts Climacus to write against such confusion of abstract theorizing about faith with lived commitment to faith. Once again, however, while the topic is narrow compared to the more thematic contributions, the implications of this brief passage do have a direct bearing on how the whole of the Postscript is to be understood. Mooney’s treatment is highly sensitive to the tone and style of Kierkegaard’s literary artistry, and his piece is the most evocatively written of the twelve as well. Mooney I think pinpoints a crucial dynamic that lies not just at the heart of the Postscript but of Kierkegaard’s authorship as a whole. That dynamic is the unique means by which faith navigates the inevitable losses, heartbreaks, and separations that punctuate human life. As Mooney puts it,

Farewells are exchanged in the confidence that the sun will rise, that we will awake, that the world will return, that our friends will not enter the grave in the night — even as we know that a final farewell awaits, when there will be no tomorrow, when we will not awake, when the beloved will not return (74).

It seems to me that faith is about how we press on in full recognition of this fact, without invalidating through sentimentality the eventuality of death and other departures without return, or being paralyzed by despair. In a passage relevant to this point that Mooney does not cite, Climacus writes, “It would sound like jesting if a person in receiving an invitation replied: I will come, definitely, believe me, except in case a roof tile falls down and kills me, because then I cannot come. And yet this may also be the highest earnestness.” We have to make plans and project possibilities in full awareness that it all may come to naught at any moment, and yet we cannot die the premature death of a thousand qualifications either. For my part, as much as Mooney contributes to developing this key theme, more work could yet be done here to articulate the particulars. Faith is definitely not just irony, though it resembles it, as Mooney points out (77); nor is it stoicism, nor is it seeing the world bivalently as in Jastrow’s duck-rabbit (which gets mentioned in this anthology twice too often for my taste). Mooney’s piece is to be further praised for its worthy arguments that “inwardness is both a self’s relation to itself and also its outward relation to others” (78) and that Climacus strives for an "existential ‘how’ linked to an appropriate objective ‘what’" (81). The former contention corrects those who still do not appreciate that Kierkegaard’s self is fundamentally relational with respect to itself, to others, and to the world (80); the latter is a valuable rejoinder to those who seek to reduce Kierkegaard’s message to an empty, stylized formalism that is indifferent to content.

This line of thinking is perhaps in tension with Clare Carlisle’s contribution, which maintains that “Climacus’ discussion of the task of becoming a Christian focuses on ‘how’ rather than ‘what’: on the existential form rather than the intellectual content of Christian belief” (171) but also asserts, and this perhaps goes a bit farther, that “the content of Christian doctrine is made subservient to this interpretation of human existence” (178). The word “subservient” reappears in a footnote on page 183; this claim could be stretching matters into a more contestable terrain, especially when it is placed in conversation with Mooney as well as Westphal, who in his essay — which exemplifies his usual clarity and precision — carefully teases out the meaning of the classic parable on “truth is subjectivity” about the less true prayer of the resident of Christendom as opposed to the more true prayer of the idol worshipper. This is another passage that has been misused by proponents of a Kierkegaard divorced from positive content, and Westphal ably corrects their misrepresentation of the text (139-42). (Another tension of importance to scholars who follow the secondary literature on Kierkegaard emerges between Westphal’s pointed criticism of Jon Stewart’s work (132) and Carlisle’s approving references thereto [172 n4, 176 n6, 178 n9, 178 n10, 179 n11, 180 n13].) David Law also indirectly joins in this debate in his piece when he writes that

Although Climacus repeatedly states that Christianity is not a doctrine but an existence-communication, this should not be taken to mean that he holds that Christianity lacks doctrinal content. Such a view ‘is mere chicanery,’ for ‘when the believer exists in faith, his existence has enormous content but not in the sense that yields a ยง’ (221),

and again that “Christianity does indeed have content, but the problem is that modern human beings no longer know how to relate to this content” (245). Indeed, Law’s piece as a whole is a quite valuable reconstruction of what the content of Christianity could be, in the form of an “existentialist theology,” according to the Postscript.

Finally, I must make mention of some salutary correctives and reminders offered by M.G. Piety in her "The epistemology of the Postscript," which, like Law’s essay, is a thoughtful and well-grounded reconstruction of a theme of sweeping import — in this case truth — that is never directly addressed by Climacus as such in one extended treatment but can be effectively educed from the text’s many and fragmentary discussions. Most important among these is her refreshing assertion that

Kierkegaard’s claim that truth is subjectivity means no more than that when ‘truth’ is prescriptive of an individual’s existence, the substance of the prescription ought to be expressed in that existence, not that Christianity may be ‘true’ for one person and Buddhism, for example, ‘true’ for another (201).

Piety persuasively supports her conclusion with a detailed analysis of the different senses of truth at work in the Postscript. This analysis issues in not only the important reminder cited above but also a clarifying claim that ought really to change the shape of the current debates. Climacus is often thought to be saying that truth can only ever be approximated in human life, but Piety shows through a distinction in Kierkegaard’s use of two Danish terms that are often translated with the same English one that in point of fact “It is thus possible, according to Kierkegaard, to approach ethical or religious — i.e., prescriptive — truth in the striving for it, in a sense that it is not possible to approach objective, or descriptive, truth through probability” (201). On her reading then, truth is admittedly elusive for Climacus, but not in the same way for objective truth as for ethical-religious truth.

A general reservation about this collection of essays: the obverse side of its strength, its emphasis on expansive topics, is that there is some redundancy in the themes addressed. Humor, for example, while undeniably important given that Climacus calls himself a humorist, is the primary focus of John Lippitt’s article, but humor is also treated fairly extensively by Hannay, Mooney, and Paul Muench. The same could be said for pathos or passion, which also comes up repeatedly.

I conclude with some thoughts as to topics that might be explored in greater depth in future scholarship. These are not oversights or criticisms of the essays collected here but intimations of what might yet be developed in thinking about the Postscript. Many authors, as already pointed out, address the relation of the “what” of content with the “how” of form, and, while they make significant points about this relation, there may yet be the need to think these two dimensions in their togetherness. Readings that attempt a collapse of one of these to the other cannot be sustained, but how to understand their relation precisely is clearly a matter of ongoing debate. On a similar point, many of the authors refer to the Climacan theme of treating the absolute absolutely and the relative relatively (Ferreira, 14; Westphal, 147; Law, 228). This too seems like a well-established notion that all agree has an important place in the text, but more could be said about how such a notion is lived out and more arguably could be said about what exactly is meant by the “absolute” in this context. Are the absolute and relative strictly opposed to one another? Are they distinguished as metaphysical terms, picking out realities that differ by grade or degree of being, or are they value designations, or both? Finally, the idea of immanence as it presents itself in Kierkegaard’s writings is raised on a few occasions and only in passing. It is not a sufficiently important point to demand of any of these contributors that they offer a comprehensive account of immanence in Kierkegaard, but the references do raise the question of what a Kierkegaardian theory of immanence might look like, especially since immanence is enjoying renewed popularity among Kierkegaard’s inheritors and because it surely stands in unavoidable relationship with its more obviously Kierkegaardian twin, transcendence. This collection overall contains significant steps forward in our understanding of this complex text, the difficulty of which continues to reward the sharpest critical study.