Kierkegaard's Fear and Trembling: A Critical Guide

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Daniel Conway (ed.), Kierkegaard's Fear and Trembling: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 278pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107034617.

Reviewed by Michael Strawser, University of Central Florida


It is not an exaggeration to say that Fear and Trembling (1843) is Kierkegaard's most difficult work to interpret. Kierkegaard compounds the essential difficulty that lies within the theme of the work, the Akedah, through choosing a pseudonym by the name of Johannes de silentio to praise Abraham as a knight of faith and examine his movements. That the pseudonym's perspective is shrouded in silence thus seemingly precludes any clear and straightforward understanding of this work. Ultimately, whether Kierkegaard's Johannes de silentio is to be read with irony or edification appears as undecidable as whether we should view Abraham as a murderous madman -- who in contrast to Nietzsche's madman proclaiming the death of god proclaims a living god who has commanded the death of his son and then later a ram -- or the great father of faith. Despite several overlapping themes, the essays in Conway's edited collection testify to this monumental undecidability and the impossibility of a unified, non-paradoxical understanding of the nature of faith. Not even able to agree on exactly how to refer to the pseudonymous author -- who throughout thirteen chapters is referred to in eight different ways (i.e., Johannes de silentio, Johannes de Silentio, Johannes de silentio, "Johannes de Silentio," Johannes, de silentio, de Silentio, and Silentio) -- the essays provide readers with multiple interpretations that explore the depths and nuances of a text which Kierkegaard rightly suggested would be his most read and discussed work long after his death.

The collection includes contributions by many of the best scholars writing on Kierkegaard today, including one translator of Fear and Trembling, one co-editor of another translation of the text, and three authors who have produced book-length commentaries on Fear and Trembling. Befitting the complexity that is Kierkegaard's authorship, Conway explains in the brief "Introduction" how these essays collectively present a "complex, multi-faceted work" on a "variety of themes" and a "wide range of topics" (5), but no structure or thematic similarities are identified to guide readers as to which themes and topics are being considered by which contributors. Perhaps intentionally, then, there is no obvious organizing principle at play, as biographical, historical, literary, philosophical, psychological, and theological foci appear throughout the collection, at times isolated and at times interwoven. While multiple interpretative questions are identified in the "Introduction," perhaps the best guiding question is put by Vanessa Rumble, who in the final contribution asks: "What is afoot in Fear and Trembling, in its strangely unanchored fantasies and evocations of atrocity?" (251).

"Homing in on Fear and Trembling" is the opening chapter, and here Alastair Hannay, translator of Fear and Trembling (Penguin Classics, 1986), shows readers how Kierkegaard's personal decision to end his engagement with Regine Olsen is linked to themes in Fear and Trembling. Hannay also situates Kierkegaard's text within the intellectual climate of his time, as he explains the idealistic philosophies of Schelling and Hegel and their relevance for reading Fear and Trembling. Hannay makes good use of Kierkegaard's journals and notebooks to show how Kierkegaard related his own struggles in maintaining a God-relationship to Abraham's situation, but Hannay suggests in his conclusion that we should not infer from Fear and Trembling that we are called to follow the particular example of Abraham.

While Hannay makes a distinction between a Judaic and Christian reading of the Akedah, Jacob Howland specifically situates Fear and Trembling within a Judaic context. In "Fear and Trembling's 'Attunement' as midrash," he shows how we can benefit from reading the "Exordium" or "Attunement" as related to rabbinic literature as well as how this section illuminates the intellectual and spiritual isolation of Silentio.

Two contributions that focus directly on the "Problemata" are "Johannes de silentio's dilemma" by Claire Carlisle and "Particularity and ethical attunement: situating Problema III," by Conway. Carlisle, author of Kierkegaard's Fear and Trembling: A Reader's Guide (2010), attends to the dilemma that either Abraham is a lost and murderous person or his faith represents the paradox that the individual stands in a higher relationship to the absolute than the universal. Carlisle sketches in detail the historical context of Fear and Trembling to show how it provides a direct challenge to Hegelian theology, while Conway explores Problema III in a way meant to attune us to an ethical interpretation of the dilemma. According to Conway, Johannes's example of the mother deceptively weaning her child shows that we can allow for ethically defensible exceptions to universal moral rules. Thus, we can reason by analogy that Abraham's deceptive silence towards his loved ones is ethically motivated. Does this analogy work? Although Conway does not call into question the weaning practices described in the "Attunement" (e.g., Is deceptively blackening the breast a sound practice?), he nevertheless exposes the limits of the analogy, for unlike the mother, the goal of Abraham's actions are at best ethically dubious, leaving him to remain forever an "ethically enigmatic figure" (227).

In "Why Moriah?: weaning and the trauma of transcendence in Kierkegaard's Fear and Trembling," Rumble questions the meaning of the weaning epigrams and offers a reading that exceeds the more noticeable themes of the text and thus exposes a covert theme that is at once biographical, literary, philosophical, and psychological. On this reading, weaning represents the profound suffering of individuation and the traumatic loss of the other. As Rumble explains, Kierkegaard was all too well acquainted with the sorrow of personal loss, for by the early age of 21 he had lived through the deaths of three sisters (two of whom died from complications related to childbirth), two brothers, and his mother. Rumble insightfully suggests that Fear and Trembling does not call us to embrace an unclear divine command but rather to accompany each other along the road of suffering and thereby embrace the finitude to which we belong.

A related, but contrasting view is found in "Birth, love, and hybridity: Fear and Trembling and the Symposium." Here Edward F. Mooney, author of Knights of Faith and Resignation: Reading Kierkegaard's Fear and Trembling (1991), and Dana Lloyd offer a poetically tuned essay focusing on maternity and the feminine, which has notably been neglected by most Kierkegaard scholars to date. On this reading the example of the weaning mother is Silentio's attempt to create a female knight of faith focused on birth to counterbalance the Abrahamic knight of faith and his movement towards death. Mooney and Lloyd explore these and related themes in comparison to Plato's Symposium, showing the hybridity at play in both Kierkegaard and Plato and offering us a rich alternative view of philosophy.

Another comparative study is offered by John Davenport in "Eschatological faith and repetition: Kierkegaard's Abraham and Job." Here Davenport extends his eschatological reading of Fear and Trembling, developed in three prior publications, in which he understands faith as trust in God's fulfilling higher ethical ideals that are beyond human agency. Such is the case in the return of Isaac to Abraham, who according to Davenport cannot truly be considered a murderer. By comparing Abraham in Fear and Trembling to Job in Repetition, Davenport shows how the religion of the latter helps clarify the faith of the former. This comparison further elucidates the theologically tuned view of eschatological trust, and Davenport also responds to prominent objections, including one found in Merold Westphal's recent book Kierkegaard's Concept of Faith (2014).

The eschatological interpretation is complemented and extended by John Lippitt's, "Learning to hope: the role of hope in Fear and Trembling." Here Lippitt, author of The Routledge Guidebook to Kierkegaard's Fear and Trembling (2015), brings the significance of hope to the fore through initially considering Kierkegaard's edifying discourse titled "The Expectancy of Faith" published in the same year as Fear and Trembling. Lippitt outlines Davenport's view, showing why it is useful and how certain problems can be avoided, and he then brings it into discussion with Jonathan Lear's Radical Hope (2006). Equally informed by Kierkegaard's Works of Love (1847), we learn that hope has only to do with the eternal and that without love hope amounts to nothing. On Lippitt's account Abraham further teaches us that existential faith is linked with courage and humility.

Sharon Krishek also provides a heuristic reading of Abraham's example in "The existential dimension of faith." Krishek argues that throughout the pervasive suffering of loss in existence we can still affirm life and that in this regard, following Silentio, Abraham serves as "a guiding star" (107). The existential dimensions of the Akedah are thus shown to hold universal significance, as we learn the movement of resignation through which our love for the lost person is transformed into our love of God. What is most important in this account is the theological trust that paradoxically affirms existence after it has been renounced.

The question "Can an admirer of silentio's Abraham consistently believe that child sacrifice is forbidden?" is taken up by C. Stephen Evans, co-editor of Kierkegaard: Fear and Trembling  2006). Evans recognizes the difficulty of admiring Abraham, but he argues that doing so does not entail accepting the contemporary possibility of child sacrifice as legitimate. The reasoning is based on the historical and epistemic differences between Abraham's situation and our own. Evans carefully considers biblical scholarship and philosophical views of Descartes, Kant, and Hegel to make his case, and he openly assumes, contrary to most biblical scholars, that Genesis 22 is historical as well as the possibility that one may have an authentic personal revelation from God. However, as Rick Anthony Furtak points out in "On being moved and hearing voices: passion and religious experience in Fear and Trembling," Silentio is silent about how we should consider Abraham's experience of divine revelation phenomenologically. Furtak's reading of Fear and Trembling and relevant passages from Kierkegaard's notebooks shows that Abraham cannot have rationally known whether the divine revelation was authentic or not, and this lack of certainty justifies Furtak's thesis that it is passion rather than reason that plays a central role in Abraham's thinking. Contrary to Maimonides but in agreement with William James, Furtak shows how for Kierkegaard affectivity has an epistemic truth value and to think otherwise would be irrational.

Jeffrey Hanson investigates the related idea that Abraham experiences an inner truth that cannot be expressed in rational discourse. Abraham's words in Genesis 22:8 -- "God himself will provide the lamb for the burnt offering" -- and Silentio's attention to these words take center stage in his "'He speaks in tongues': hearing the truth of Abraham's words of faith." According to Hanson these words serve as a paradigm for all utterances of faith, as they express both trust and indeterminacy, and they are not to be taken wholly literally or wholly figuratively. Hanson provides an interesting comparison between Abraham's words and the promise "I will love you always," suggesting that similar to an expression of faith a promise of love invokes a divine language or speaking in tongues. This is not to suggest, as Alasdair MacIntyre does, that the Kierkegaardian knight of faith is an irrationalist, and Anthony Rudd explains why in, "Narrative unity and the moment of crisis in Fear and Trembling." Here Rudd argues for a narrativist understanding of Abraham's faith that is consistent with the ethical life. According to Rudd, Kierkegaard wants readers to realize that an account of faith that is entirely incommunicable is implausible, and even if certain aspects of the Abraham story appear incommunicable, there is still "a kind of narrative intelligibility to them" (204).

While Rudd attends to the ethical context of Fear and Trembling and Hanson addresses the factual error involved in having a ram and not a lamb serve for the burnt offering, it is surprising that no contributor to this volume directly considers the ethical problem of animal sacrifice and the difficulty it raises for maintaining the praiseworthiness of the Abraham story. While Evans explained that a contemporary who was serious about performing child sacrifice should rightfully be considered mentally ill, how should we consider the patriarch's supposedly actual performance of animal sacrifice? How does this express a higher ethical ideal? How does the willful destruction of an innocent animal life actually serve to affirm life? While several contributors sensitively discuss the oft-neglected feminine perspectives in their readings of Fear and Trembling, there does not appear to be any comparable sensitivity towards the animal. Perhaps this is because Silentio's text is neglectfully silent in this regard, although as Maurice Blanchot suggests in When the Time Comes (1951), a critical account of the Akedah must address the actual non-human animal victim of the sacrifice.

Overall, readers of this volume will be treated to subtle and sophisticated readings of Kierkegaard's most challenging text, but they should not expect the variety of interpretations to remove the opacity from Abraham, for his "indefinitely indeterminate status" (228) remains intact. As the editor Conway suggests in his own contribution, the issue that remains for readers is whether or not "to be done with Abraham" (228). The authors of this volume demonstrate their commitment to continue the struggle to understand the paradox of Abraham's faith read through a Kierkegaardian lens, and thus it is not surprising that the pervasive tone of this critical guide is more apologetic than disapproving. Whereas for Kafka the old story of Abraham is no longer worthy of discussion (a critical view not directly considered here), for Conway "we cannot simply give up, . . . we must continue . . . [in our] steadfast refusal to be done with Abraham" (227-228). For Silentio, however, whether or not we should be done with Abraham quite fittingly remains wholly undecidable, thus leaving the decision up to each individual reader.