Kierkegaard's Fear and Trembling: A Reader's Guide

Placeholder book cover

Clare Carlisle, Kierkegaard's Fear and Trembling: A Reader's Guide, Continuum, 2010, 212pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781847064615.

Reviewed by Alastair Hannay, University of Oslo


The Continuum Reader's Guides aim to give "clear and accessible introductions to classic works of philosophy." The author of this Guide makes it clear that she has planned to write an "accessible commentary" on Fear and Trembling. Commentaries and introductions are not the same. Introductions give you the lay of the land, guides (commentaries) are detailed maps that assist progress through the landscape. Like following a scenic route with a map and historical vade mecum, reading Fear and Trembling with a guide book in hand will seem out of place to many. Clare Carlisle's book is full of useful information and fruitful reflection, but it would be a shame to offer it to someone who has yet to read Fear and Trembling. For others it has much to offer and chew over. Introduction? No.

Carlisle's commentary, forming the second of the book's three chapters ("Reading the Text"), is nearly three times longer than the other two combined. Readers who prefer "a shorter overall discussion" are invited to skip this chapter, moving directly from "Overview of Themes and Context" to "Reception and Influence". Since the outside chapters are, to this reviewer's mind, more open to critical comment than the extended commentary, the main focus here is on these, with only the following brief account of the second chapter.

This central chapter starts on a theme begun in the opening chapter's penultimate section ("Critique of the Modern Age -- And of Modern Philosophy") by providing a role for Fear and Trembling in a wider nineteenth-century context of Marx, Darwin, and Nietzsche. Carlisle notes how the preface and epilogue, neither of which mentions the biblical account that is Fear and Trembling's raw material, frame and situate the issues raised. Once properly understood, the Preface "provides the key to reading the text" (p. 29). It talks of spiritual decline and it is this trend that the book's "interpretation of the [biblical] story" attempts to "arrest and reverse" (p. 30). In Fear and Trembling, as indeed "in many of Kierkegaard's texts," the question of the value of faith is "connected to a critique of modern philosophy, and especially of Hegel's ideas" (p. 23).

The virtues of this long chapter, and the effort that has gone into it, will be evident to anyone embarking on it. It gives greater (though in this reviewer's opinion still not enough) emphasis on the Hegelian background than we expect among Anglophone commentators on the European side of the Atlantic. References that Kierkegaard could leave to his readers to decipher are identified, themes (doubt, faith, autonomy) are brought to the table, and Descartes's methodological doubt briefly explained (for the uninitiated) and ushered into a Hegelian context. Reading "Reading the Text" leaves one with Carlisle's own reading, but there is a remedial sprinkling of different takes on isolated matters due to a small selection of commentators. References to others with a stronger background in German Idealism might have helped. However, Carlisle has acknowledged (p. x) that her 'introduction' is only "one possible interpretation of Kierkegaard's text", and, recognizing that any "introduction" to Fear and Trembling runs the risk of defeating the pseudonymous author's desire not to be "cut into paragraphs" (p. 39), she succeeds in keeping accounts open, though whether this is what she wants is unclear. In the closing chapter she remarks on an openness in Kierkegaard's text that makes it "rather elusive" (p. 176). Does she find this frustrating, or is it a convenient means of paragraph-prevention?

The first chapter downloads many themes, rather more than its integrity requires or can stand. We know that the real-life story of Kierkegaard's broken engagement underlies the sacrifice theme in Fear and Trembling, but does the reader have to be apprised of this in order to appreciate that the book is not just about the relationship to God? (p. 10). Further, might it not be a kind of misguidance to introduce topics ("Spheres of Existence: Aesthetic, Ethical, and Religious") that are introduced as such to Kierkegaard's readers only later? With "Religion and Ethics: Faith and Reason" we are on firmer ground, or closer to home. But here too there is a tendency to over-read; the ethics that is to prove inadequate in Abraham's defence is introduced in terms of "rational, universal laws." Although Kierkegaard is rightly pitted against the Kant of Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, this specifically Kantian notion of the ethical nowhere surfaces in the text. The text itself guides us to Hegel rather than Kant, as Carlisle faithfully notes (in the central chapter) when adverting to Johannes de silentio's references to Hegel's Philosophy of Right in the three "problemata" (p. 99). But some Kant is helpful, and Carlisle navigates us between the Scylla and Charybdis of Luther's rash appreciation of Abraham for the blindness of his faith and Kant's rationalist dismissal of him for failing to recognize that God could not have been the source of the command to kill Isaac.

The focal dilemma remains unresolved: either Abraham is a murderer or "we admit … that religious faith transcends the requirements of ethics and reason" (p. 18). Tackling the pseudonym's own professed inability to take the step to faith, Carlisle finds support in the text for a distinction between a "theoretical or conceptual" and a "practical or existential" reading of the "paradox" of Abraham's faith. This allows the content of faith to escape absurdity, at least if "murderer" can be kept out, while the practical paradox may be successfully negotiated by someone without Johannes de silentio's limitations. Support for this comes from a journal entry from seven years later in which Kierkegaard affirms that, to the believer, neither faith itself nor its content is absurd (p. 20). The impression we receive is of a Johannes de silentio constructed to carry out a special mission. Fear and Trembling is designed to face those who cannot but see Abrahamian faith as paradoxical with the realization that they are not believers, thus putting them in a better position to properly "take up the task" (p. 21).

In "Telling Stories -- and Who is Johannes de silentio?" Carlisle wonders whether, just as Abraham is Johannes de silentio's "hero," so might Johannes be Kierkegaard's -- not in the sense of the book's first-person protagonist, but as a character who, knowing what he does and doesn't understand, admits "his own limitations" (p. 26). Like the messenger in the book's "enigmatic epigraph," unaware that he is conveying instructions to put the leaders of Gabii to death and who can only report that Tarquin cut off the heads of the tallest poppies (p. 26), Johannes conveys a message about Christian faith which, as a poet versed in Hegel, he himself cannot understand. We have thus one way of deciphering the epigraph's own hidden message. Another way has Abraham as messenger, conveying, by his trust in God, another kind of God-relationship which he only anticipates, but of which he can have no idea (p. 27).

To acquire a "sense of the variety of interpretative directions that have been taken by scholars," travelers through the long middle chapter are asked, when turning to "Reception and Influence," to "take a step back" from the text (p. 175). The "most famous intellectual heirs," not being "as a rule" among Kierkegaard's "most attentive readers," are swiftly passed over. Attention is directed instead upon "a [very] small selection of the very large … body of secondary literature … available in English." Economizing in this way, Carlisle hopes to stimulate reflection on the "ideas presented" by Fear and Trembling and "the questions it poses" (p. 175). Themes come under four headings.

In the first, "Faith, Ethics, and Johannes de silentio's Dilemma," ethics is now understood in generally Hegelian terms, though with Kantian implications. These terms allow faith to coincide with the "ethical sphere," corresponding to something like the climate of opinion in Kierkegaard's time. But this coincidence of faith and civic virtue is historically contingent, as witnessed by Christianity's origins. So they can in principle come apart in the future (p. 179). Fear and Trembling's feat, by "hold[ing] apart the religious and ethical spheres" in the way presented by Johannes de silentio's dilemma, is to reveal "the kind of inward decision" required by faith but which a "supposedly Christian culture of [Kierkegaard's] time" conveniently passed over. Carlisle is careful to point out that the inward requirement doesn't mean that religion is to be "individualistic or otherworldly"; indeed the "central" problem of Fear and Trembling is how "the relationship to God should be lived out in the world, through relationships with other people" (p. 180).

The next section ("In Defence of the Ethical") has Johannes de silentio deliberately overstating the options facing Abraham's insistent admirer. They are presented as: either one must accept murder as a holy act, to be admired as such, or "there is no such thing as faith" (p. 180). The remaining sections are attempts to find a more moderate account of the options still within a framework of "dilemma." Redeeming features are sought that can save Abraham for an expanded ethics that takes account of human failure. Following critical reference to Levinas, Derrida, C. Stephen Evans, and Stephen Mulhall, all tending in various degrees to defuse the dilemma, faith is presented here as introducing an "infinite dimension" (p. 182) that provides an end (telos) to which ethics itself is subservient. More than simply allowing that something of one's humanity survives significant failure to be moral in the Sittlichkeit way, this telos can call for actual contraventions of Sittlichkeit. But murder, or sacrifice of a son by any other word? To counter Johannes's overstatement, we can follow his own advice when telling us that it is by faith, not by murder, that "one acquires a resemblance to Abraham" (p. 180).

A further redeeming feature in Abraham that can "provide a criterion of ethical value … common to both religious and non-religious perspectives" is trust (p. 186). In "The Value of Trust" Carlisle introduces a group of commentators (Robert M. Adams, Jung H. Lee, Sharon Krishek, John J. Davenport) who focus on Abraham's trust rather than his obedience. With the first two of these in mind, she warns against "adopting a purely intellectualist approach," as for instance when raising the question of whether Abraham was justified in trusting himself as able to identify God as the giver of the command (p. 188). As for Krishek, although pointing to love as a component in religious faith, and putting us in mind of the fact that "fear of loss" can be as significant an obstacle as self-interest to fulfilling ethical demands (p. 190), she fails to explain how one can hold on to a possibility (in Abraham's case that of continuing to exercise his fatherly love of Isaac in this world after sacrificing him) when reason tells us it is humanly impossible. As against Kant, the framework from within which the question of what the ethical and the religious have in common remains perforce firmly religious (p. 192). Bringing the religious down to earth, Carlisle concludes by proposing a naturalistic understanding of restoration in the case of irreparable loss. The past cannot be returned, but we can return to it -- and find forgiveness. Thus, still from within a religious framework, the past can be transformed from being a "source of guilt and resentment" into an "opportunity to develop wisdom and compassion" (p. 193).

In a final section, a certain kind of courage is added to Abraham's repertoire. A merely human courage is enough for renouncing "the whole of temporality in order to win eternity," but "it takes a paradoxical and humble courage then to grasp the whole of reality on the strength of the absurd."[1] With a case study due to Jonathan Lear we are put in mind of our vulnerability even in the ethical sphere. George Pattison has pointed to a counterbalance in the Upbuilding Discourses to the outwardly aggressive aspect of Abraham's faith. It adds to suffering an element of patience. Carlisle suggests (p. 199) that Fear and Trembling "has something to teach us about such a radical and responsive kind of courage." "We," in this case, can be "Christians, or Muslims, or Buddhists, or socialists, or philosophers, or whatever" (p 197). She concludes her Guide by asking (p. 199): "Can we regard the courage of faith, with its distinctive quality of receptivity, as a purely human possibility?" Openness indeed. She refrains from saying that an affirmative answer would cancel Johannes de silentio's dilemma, or whether canceling it would make Johannes himself redundant. There is food here for further thought.

"Paradox" signifies the more-than-human, but Carlisle wonders if the possibility of a claim higher than that of the ethical life might apply even in "the task of becoming a human being" (p. 197, original emphasis). We should however note Kierkegaard's insistence that Christianity alone justifies the elevation of the particular over the universal. And in promoting his favored "category of the single individual," he says that the "particulaire" becomes "true" only in a God-relationship.[2] In Fear and Trembling the paradox that terminally bewilders Johannes de silentio is the very idea that the "the single individual" should stand in an "absolute relation to the absolute."[3] But the God-relationship in which the truth of particularity can be acquired goes via the God-Man, who is himself the paradox in whom the believer must believe. Does Carlisle believe that facing the God-Man square on may be a purely human possibility?

While Carlisle's commentary-plus gives excellent support to readings of Fear and Trembling that favor some alleviation of what many see as its excesses, a closer look at the Hegel connection (from p. 99) might have helped readers to grasp the roles of these "excesses." For the Hegel of Philosophy of Right, Abraham's committed deference to God would count as "subjective opinion and caprice,"[4] whatever God's command. Caprice is one thing and murder another, but for Hegel still capricious. An inversion of Hegel's elevation of the universal over the particular had recently been aired in Either/Or by Judge Wilhelm. In signing off he had speculated on the fate of someone who "puts himself outside the universal,"[5] even hinting at the possibility of a "more noble sense" of being "out of the common."[6] His limitations as an ethicist prevented him imagining this, but he did realize it would have to be "something else than a capricious satisfaction of one's arbitrary desire"; he even talks of a "purgatory."[7] The biblical story in Fear and Trembling, read in this light, is a vehicle for a polemic aimed at discrediting the venerable status of the universal. The role of the Old Testament God is to produce a personification of pure particularity with only God as support -- and, talking of "heroes" (among them Johannes himself), why not also offer the accolade to this God? Is he not also a sacrificial victim of sorts, the real murderer, at any rate a literary device? Read in something like this light, the murder charge becomes as essential to the polemic as Abraham's faith.

[1] Fear and Trembling, tr, Alastair Hannay, London: Penguin Books, 1985, p. 77.

[2] Kierkegaard's Journals and Notebooks, ed. Niels Jørgen Cappelørn et al., vol. 6, forthcoming, NB11:183.

[3] Fear and Trembling, p. 144.

[4] G. W. F. Hegel, Elements of the Philosophy of Right (1821), Part 3, §144a.

[5] Either/Or: A Fragment of Life, abridged, tr. Alastair Hannay, London: Penguin Books, 1992, p. 588.

[6] Ibid., p. 589.

[7] Ibid., p. 589.