Kierkegaard's Relation to Hegel Reconsidered

Placeholder book cover

Jon Stewart, Kierkegaard's Relation to Hegel Reconsidered, Cambridge University Press, 2003, 718pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521828384

Reviewed by Matthew Edgar, Fordham University


According to standard interpretations of 19th-century European philosophy, a stark ’either / or’ divided Hegel and Kierkegaard, and this divide profoundly shaped the subsequent development of Continental philosophy well into the 20th century. While left Hegelians carried on the legacy of Hegel’s rationalism and universalism, existentialists and postmodernists found inspiration, at least in part, in Kierkegaard’s critique of systematic philosophy, rationality, and socially integrated subjectivity. In Kierkegaard’s Relation to Hegel Reconsidered, Jon Stewart provides a detailed historical argument which challenges the standard assumption that Kierkegaard’s position was developed in opposition to Hegel’s philosophy, and as such is antithetical to it. (It is worth noting that, in Hegel: Myths and Legends, Stewart criticized the ’either / or’ from the other direction, arguing that Hegel is not the arch-rationalist he is often taken to be). Without denying the existence of a certain “metalevel” dispute between Hegel and Kierkegaard, Stewart argues that (a) many of Kierkegaard’s central ideas, such as the theory of stages, are creatively, i.e., not uncritically, adopted from Hegel, and, (b) the true target of Kierkegaard’s critique is not Hegel per se, but prominent Danish Hegelians of his time. According to Stewart, ignorance of Kierkegaard’s intellectual milieu, coupled with a distorted and inadequate understanding of Hegel, has led many English-speaking critics to adopt the overly simple ’either / or’. Stewart seeks to correct this problem by showing how Kierkegaard’s writing rose out of, and responded primarily to, debates in Denmark in the 1830’s and 40’s surrounding Hegel’s philosophy and its implications for theology.

Stewart divides Kierkegaard’s corpus into three distinct stages: (1) 1834 – 1843, from early unpublished writings to The Concept of Irony and Either / Or, a period in which Kierkegaard is relatively open to, and influenced by, Hegel’s philosophy; (2) 1843 – 1846, from Fear and Trembling to Concluding Unscientific Postscript, a period of polemical attacks on Hegelianism; and (3) 1847 – 1855, from Works of Love to his death, a period in which the criticisms of Hegel subside, yet a positive influence still remains.

As his journals and writings indicate, Kierkegaard actively studied and directly quoted Hegel’s texts only in the first stage of this development. Not surprisingly, it is in this stage that the Hegelian influence is most pronounced. In his master’s thesis, The Concept of Irony, Kierkegaard’s analyses of Socratic and Romantic irony closely follow Hegel’s lectures on aesthetics and the history of philosophy. Advocates of a strong dichotomy between Hegel and Kierkegaard have argued that Kierkegaard’s use of Hegel in his thesis is itself ironic, a ploy to placate his dissertation committee and the larger, allegedly Hegelian bourgeois community. Stewart provides strong historical evidence to counter this thesis. Kierkegaard’s adviser, Frederik Christian Sibbern, was an outspoken critic of Hegel, while the only Hegelian reader, Hans Lassen Martensen, was added to the committee after the text was complete. Moreover, by the time of Kierkegaard’s thesis (1841), Hegel’s philosophy was beginning to be considered dangerous due to its association with Feurerbach and Strauss. What makes the ironic thesis seem initially plausible is the fact that many of Kierkegaard’s unpublished writings from this period are (apparently) highly critical of Hegel. While the ironic thesis tends to explain this contradiction away by arguing that Kierkegaard was consistently, if at times covertly, anti-Hegelian, Stewart takes seriously the idea that Kierkegaard worked out a more nuanced position in his early period that was neither simply pro- nor anti-Hegel. Most importantly, Stewart argues that Kierkegaard was able to make positive use of Hegel’s philosophy in the early period, even as he became increasingly critical of its reception in Denmark. What Kierkegaard criticizes in satires such as “The Battle Between the Old and New Soap-Cellars,” for example, is Hegelianism as an intellectual fad, centered cliquishly in the university around Martensen. Similarly, many of Judge Willhelm’s criticisms of Hegelianism in Either / Or focus not on Hegel’s doctrine per se, but on the deleterious effects that it can have on impressionable students; e.g., it directs their attention outward to world-history, and thereby causes them to lose sight of the most important task of ethics, namely, self- improvement. It is a sign of the complexity of Kierkegaard’s relation to Hegel in this period that in Either / Or, a work whose very title seems to challenge Hegel’s conception of the ’Aufhebung’, Willhelm argues that immediate romantic love is aufgehoben (negated qua immediate yet retained in a mediated fashion) in marriage.

The second period poses the greatest challenge to Stewart’s thesis, for it is here that we find Kierkegaard’s strongest and most sustained critique of Hegelianism. Nevertheless, Stewart argues that the vehemence and ad hominem nature of Kierkegaard’s critique suggests a target that is closer to home than Hegel, whose greatness Kierkegaard always admired. Kierkegaard’s life-long disdain for Martensen was already in evidence in his early satires, where he was portrayed as a hack who imitated and profited from Hegel’s genius, while impudently claiming to “go beyond” it. As Stewart notes, Kierkegaard’s antipathy was fueled in part by jealousy over Martensen’s popularity and his early appointment to a university position. Kierkegaard’s relation to another prominent Hegelian, Johan Ludvig Heiberg, was more complicated. In his early period, Kierkegaard sought Heiberg’s favor and published in his journal, Kjøbenhavns flyvende Post, but it was Heiberg’s dismissive review of Either / Or that ultimately provoked the often bitter and personal polemic against the Danish Hegelians found in Kierkegaard’s second period. Because of the small size of the intellectual community in Denmark, however, this polemic had to be somewhat veiled and indirect. ’Hegel’ and ’Hegelian’, along with a whole series of code words, came to be substituted for Heiberg, Martensen, and Adolph Peter Adler, another influential Danish Hegelians. While this strategy undoubtedly caused the confusion of 20th-century critics, Stewart provides ample direct evidence to show that Martensen and Kierkegaard’s other Danish contemporaries knew very well who was being attacked.

The majority of Stewart’s work is spent decoding the texts and tracing the allusions of Kierkegaard’s second period. For each of Kierkegaard’s standard criticisms of Hegel, Stewart establishes the Danish figure, text, and position that is actually being criticized. Here are a few examples: In the Fragments and elsewhere, Kierkegaard criticizes the application of the doctrine of mediation to the incarnation and the God-man relation; the critique is directed specifically at Martensen’s “Rationalism, Supernaturalism, and the principium exclusi medii,” not Hegel’s philosophy of religion. In the critique of Hegelian logic found throughout the second period, there appears to be only one direct quotation from Hegel’s Science of Logic, and nothing to suggest a serious study of that work on Kierkegaard’s part; however, allusions abound to Adler’s Popular Lectures on Hegel’s Objective Logic and Heiberg’s “The System of Logic.” Finally, the criticisms of systematic philosophy in the Prefaces and the Concluding Unscientific Postscript are aimed at Heiberg; this fact is proved in part by Kierkegaard’s repeated references to an “uncompleted system,” for Heiberg unlike Hegel never fulfilled his promise to finish his work on Logic. Throughout Stewart’s discussion of the second period, one cannot help but be impressed with his scholarship, and it is difficult to deny after reading the text that Kierkegaard was primarily concerned with his Danish contemporaries, not Hegel.

Not surprisingly, as Hegelianism began to wane in Denmark in the late 1840’s, so did Kierkegaard’s criticism of it. In his third period, Kierkegaard’s critical attention was focused primarily on the Danish Church. Nevertheless, Hegel’s positive influence can still be seen in the dialectical method of The Sickness unto Death. The lingering positive influence serves to highlight the profound impact that Hegel’s way of thinking had on Kierkegaard throughout his life. As Stewart shows, even the notion of the leap, one of the most critical concepts of Kierkegaard’s second period, had an origin at least in part in Hegel’s logic. Instead of simply rejecting Hegel, Kierkegaard consistently borrowed from and reinterpreted Hegelian concepts and methodologies to suit his purposes, even when his purpose ran counter to that of Hegel. Hence, Kierkegaard simply cannot be the rabid anti-Hegelian he is often made out to be.

The question repeatedly raised by Stewart’s analysis is to what extent any given critique of the Danish Hegelians can be considered a critique of Hegel’s philosophy itself. In some cases, it is relatively clear that the position that Kierkegaard is attacking is not attributable to Hegel; for example, in Johannes Climacus, or De Omnibus dubitandum est, the primary target is Cartesian doubt and Martensen’s adoption of it. In other cases, however, what one makes of Stewart’s argument will depend upon how one reads Hegel. Stewart tends toward a deflationary reading of Hegel, and often his argument rests on the claim that the Danish Hegelians have exaggerated, improperly extended, misapplied, or distanced themselves from Hegel’s philosophy. At several points throughout the text, Stewart takes a break from his exposition in order to show how Hegel’s position differs from the Danish Hegelian position. It is not always clear, however, that the difference cuts deep enough to take Hegel out of the line of fire.

Take, for instance, the crucial question of the relation between philosophy and religion. Philosophy according to Hegel seeks to comprehend the content of Christianity conceptually, whereas Christian faith according to Kierkegaard is an infinite pathos that is evoked and sustained by the paradox of incarnation. Here, it would seem, we face a genuine disagreement between Kierkegaard and Hegel himself, yet Stewart argues that Kierkegaard only challenges Heiberg, who claimed that philosophy includes and accounts for private religious emotions. Hegel is not the target of critique, for on the one hand, Hegel openly acknowledges that private feelings fall below the level of the concept, and on the other hand, Kierkegaard admits that the speculative philosopher or theologian can also be a knight of faith. Instead of an ’either / or’, we have a kind of ’both / and’, where Hegel’s philosophy is valid in the sphere of objective thought, and Kierkegaard’s in the sphere of personal existence. Neither Hegel nor Kierkegaard would be satisfied with this conclusion, however, for the issue dividing them is which sphere is ’higher’ or closer to the truth. Hegel believes that religion is the penultimate form of consciousness which must be surpassed precisely because it is mired in the immediacy of feelings, whereas Kierkegaard holds that faith is higher, for it involves passion and risk in the difficult task of holding fast to that which escapes cognition. Although it may very well be true that Kierkegaard never challenged Hegel himself on this point, Stewart must ultimately acknowledge that there is a ’metalevel’ dispute, a conflict of paradigms, as it were, between universal reason and personal authenticity, in their accounts of religion (and a similar conflict in their accounts of ethics).

This last point should not be read as a criticism of Stewart’s work, for his primary objective is to refute the simple ’either / or’ with a more historically informed reading of the Hegel-Kierkegard relation, and in this task his work is without a doubt successful. Moreover, the idea of a metalevel or metaphilosophical conflict between Hegel and Kierkegaard nicely captures the complexity of the relation. On the one hand, because Kierkegaard was not interested in a point by point, wholesale rejection of Hegel, but rather attempted to open a new avenue of discussion and research, he could freely adopt Hegelian ideas and motifs à la the bricoleur while distancing himself from Hegel’s overall project. On the other hand—and here is where I would differ from Stewart—the metalevel thesis provides a good way of understanding the real division that occurred in 19th-century philosophy after Hegel. Stewart is no doubt right to insist that many of the left Hegelians were extremely critical of Hegel, and hence that the categories ’Hegelian’ and ’anti-Hegelian’ can seem somewhat arbitrary. Nonetheless, the criticisms raised by Marx, for example, are for the most part immanent criticisms, and his philosophical project is thus fairly continuous with Hegel’s, e.g., both privilege rationality and universality, and both develop a teleological view of history. In contrast, Kierkegaard sought to challenge Hegel’s philosophy from the margins, as it were, and for this reason he is rightly regarded as an initiator, along with Nietzsche, of the counter discourse that resulted in existentialism and postmodernism.