Kierkegaard's Upbuilding Discourses: Philosophy, theology, literature

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Pattison, George, Kierkegaard's Upbuilding Discourses: Philosophy, theology, literature, Routledge, 2002, 240pp, $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0415283701.

Reviewed by M. Jamie Ferreira, University of Virginia


Pattison explores a genre of Kierkegaard’s writings that is less well-known than either his popular pseudonymous works or his explicitly Christian works—namely, the upbuilding discourses written in Kierkegaard’s own name and published in tandem with the pseudonymous works. Elegantly and clearly written, this study argues that these discourses (in addition to the popular Eighteen Upbuilding Discourses, Pattison treats Discourses on Imagined Occasions and Discourses in Various Spirits) collectively provide a privileged viewpoint on the authorship as a whole. His approach to these discourses is informed both by the implications of Kierkegaard’s unpublished “Lectures on Communication” (1847) concerning indirect communication, as well as Kierkegaard’s own appreciative assessments of rhetorical form and situation. Pattison makes an intriguing case for rejecting other philosophical readings of the discourses—e.g., in terms of dialectics, phenomenology, and the Kantian idea of the sublime—as a complement to his own positive thesis that these discourses highlight the categories of ‘love’ and ‘upbuilding’ (or ‘love as upbuilding’) and thereby provide a unifying center illuminating the entire authorship (an inexhaustible unity-in-diversity, to be sure, rather than any uniformity, but still a challenge to those who deny any unity in the authorship).

Pattison also proposes that these discourses reveal ways in which the entire authorship is open to a “philosophical” reading. What he means by such a philosophical reading is that there is a sense in which we can understand even the specifically Christian works without the “prior acceptance of dogmatic principles or ecclesiastical authority” (193). The Christian works do, Pattison admits, “presuppose a set of distinctively Christian presuppositions” (208), but he argues that the kind of “moral and personal reflection that the upbuilding discourses seek to arouse” reveals that “Kierkegaardian faith” is not absolutely heterogeneous, but “comes as the final expression of a process of understanding that is firmly and broadly contextualized in human experience” (205). In other words, because the meaning of the human and divine love narrated in the upbuilding discourses is “not strange to us” (204), religious faith is not ultimately strange to us. This argument for a kind of humanistic continuity is made in the service of what Pattison himself terms a “strong claim”—namely,

Kierkegaard is a paradigmatic thinker for the regeneration of moral discourse in a situation determined by the collapse or problematisation of the grand narratives of religion and social progress and the inability of science to move beyond an essentially reductionist approach to religion and ethics (9).

Kierkegaard’s usefulness in this respect is a function of reading themes in the discourses (ideals like ‘love hides a multitude of sins’ and pictures of loving forgiveness or “becoming as nothing”) as “regulative” principles that guide our life but “do not presuppose any general ontology or any particular world-view” (9). He is explicitly aware of the danger of mining the discourses for anthropological content at the cost of theological conclusions (169), but his claim that these discourses do not contribute to any ontology, religious or otherwise (93), is provocative (to say the least) when applied to regulative ideals like “becoming transparent to God.”

An important contribution is made by Pattison when he begins a project that should be continued by others—namely, reading the contemporaneous signed and unsigned works in light of each other. One of the most suggestive and beautiful chapters gives a lengthy illustration of how the discourses that were published on the same day as Fear and Trembling can provide fresh insights into that work, one we probably all feel very familiar with already. Moreover, when one thought nothing new could be said about the role of the broken engagement, Pattison (resisting standard psychobiography) does just that by exploring that theme in the light of the discourses.

Overall, the book argues for a kind of humanistic continuity, such that Christian religiousness is “conceived,” and therefore conceivable, “within a framework erected on the ground of common human experience and understanding” (215); this continuity, however, should be clearly distinguished from a stronger claim, which Pattison attributes to Works of Love, namely, that distinctively Christian religious experience is the “demand[ed]” “fulfillment” of “a logic inscribed in the very structures of human beings’ quest for self-knowledge and their attempts to speak rightly about love” (215). This worry aside, the book does a valuable service: both because this is the first full-length treatment of the upbuilding discourses in English and because Pattison has impressive literary and artistic sensitivities, this study should interest a wide range of readers. In sum, the portrait of these discourses is so engagingly fashioned, readers should be eager to visit or revisit them.