Kierkegaard's Dancing Tax Collector: Faith, Finitude, and Silence

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Sheridan Hough, Kierkegaard's Dancing Tax Collector: Faith, Finitude, and Silence, Oxford University Press, 2015, 169pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198739999.

Reviewed by Sharon Krishek, The Hebrew University of Jerusalem


Fear and Trembling, Kierkegaard's well-known treatise on the nature of faith, is arguably one of the most appealing and influential essays in the bountiful corpus that the 19th century religious philosopher created during his short life. The ongoing interest in this intriguing piece is therefore both justified and welcome. Sheridan Hough makes a contribution to the existing scholarship on Fear and Trembling by approaching this text from a somewhat uncommon perspective. While Kierkegaard (under the pseudonym Johannes de Silentio) analyzes faith using the biblical Abraham, she foregrounds a different protagonist -- to whom Kierkegaard gives much weight, but not as much attention. Imagined by Kierkegaard to be a contemporary analogous to Abraham, this man does not look anything like the father of faith. Rather, he looks like a tax collector: as far as can be from a deeply religious or spiritual man.

Hough expresses an unreserved admiration for this figure, to whom she refers as 'the tax collector'[1]. Her reason for considering him as exemplifying a spiritual-existential ideal is "his mastery of simply being human . . . the way in which he is located". By this Hough means that 'the tax collector' is "supremely present": he is immersed in his existence and fully affirms it in terms of being located "in place" (10), "in time" (12), "in movement" (13), and, "most importantly", in pleasure (14). This connection to pleasure (or joy[2]) is, I believe, the crux of the matter. Underlying Hough's preoccupation with 'the tax collector' is the following problem (although she does not formulate it as such): how is it possible to be joyful -- to affirm and trust human existence as essentially good -- when life provides ample evidence to the contrary? In what follows I will present what I take to be the answer of Hough's study to this important question, and then indicate more generally what I consider the strengths and weaknesses of this book.

Hough's point of departure is Kierkegaard's meditation on the verse "Every good and every perfect gift is from above" (James 1:17), and in particular Kierkegaard's assertion that "the Father of Lights . . . at every moment . . . makes everything a good and perfect gift for everyone who has enough heart to be humble" (EUD, 41; cited. 28). Of course, there is an important difference between the verse that only attests the origin of good gifts, and its Kierkegaardian variation that claims that every gift is good (for the humble-hearted), but Hough seems to accept this transition as natural. Claiming that "The difficulty of the verse is an epistemological one: how does a person know when she has received one of God's good and perfect gifts?" (27, she takes Kierkegaard's reading to address precisely this difficulty. She claims:

Kierkegaard interprets this passage epistemologically: we are not in a position -- God's position -- to judge the absolute scope and nature of what befalls us. A person dwelling in faith will 'take up' life's events and accidents as 'good and perfect' -- an orientation that does not proclaim that a particular misfortune is in fact good; rather, that person lives (paradoxically) with the assurance that nothing, no situation, is beyond God's transformational power (84-5).

It therefore seems that the 'epistemological difficulty' Hough is interested in does not pertain to our inability to judge some X that "befalls us" as bad, wrong, or disastrous: following Kierkegaard, she holds that "objectively" speaking, any misfortune X is indeed bad. What we lack is the knowledge that allows us to understand how God's "transformational power" can turn that bad X into a "good and perfect gift". Accepting the latter means to have "confidence . . . in a vocational outcome, because everything can be -- and will be -- made use of, no matter how ordinary or disruptive (or indeed catastrophic)" (26). Thus, it seems that the 'epistemic flexibility' that characterizes faith (according to Hough) amounts to the ability to consider everything whatsoever as subject to God's "transformational power".

And how is this ability gained? "Faith's 'epistemic flexibility' -- the knowledge that every gift is good and perfect -- is, avers Kierkegaard, made available by communion" (111). In what way? Here confession (part of the "preparation" (111) for communion, according to Kierkegaard) plays a central rule:

By bringing his sinful self before God in confession, the [sinner] is now able to see what needs revision . . . and in turn to see God's infinite capacity to assist in repair. . . . What he needs is a way out of his impossible maze of behaviors, and that is what his cry reveals to him: God's infinite transformational power is always already present (116).

If I understand correctly, the idea is something like the following. The special nature of confession (and thus communion) makes possible a belief in God's transformational power: the sinner acknowledges his hopeless situation -- he cannot extract himself from his sinfulness -- and yet remains hopeful thanks to his belief in God's redeeming power. Thus, confession is an encounter with God's "transformational power" as it represents the possibility of being saved. Once acknowledged, this power should become relevant to any domain in the sinner/believer's life. Thus, confession (and accordingly communion) gains for him 'epistemic flexibility' -- namely, considering everything as "a good and perfect gift" -- which is indispensable to his faith qua an affirmation of life. Indispensable, that is, to considering human life as good, despite its inherent limitedness and suffering.

However, I would like to question Hough's understanding of the idea of "transformational power". She claims that "God can make any gift good and perfect" (29, her emphasis), but this may easily evoke an objection. Could a believer conceive, say, the agonizing death of a child as "a good and perfect gift"? Indeed, Hough is well aware of such a possible objection and specifically asks: "how does the phenomenon of faith address the manifold misery, disaster, and horror of human life?" She immediately replies: "The answer, of course, is that it does not. Nor can it" (141). Here the reader might feel baffled. This statement seems to be a suitable reply to a different question: if one should ask how faith justifies suffering or, alternatively, nullifies it, then the answer should unequivocally be "of course it does not, nor can it". But to claim that faith cannot address suffering seems to imply that faith is irrelevant to suffering. Such an implication, however, is inconsistent with Hough's admiration of 'the tax collector' who knows how to affirm his life (and thus address the suffering it entails) precisely by virtue of his faith. It seems to me that Hough can commit herself to these two contradictory convictions only by adopting what ultimately looks like a dichotomous approach to human life:

objectively, a person living in faith must evaluate and acknowledge the fabric of finitude, the laws of its wrap and weft; this is the objective condition, one always available to reason. Subjectively, a person 'believes' in the conceptually thin/existentially rich notion that 'every gift is good and perfect'. This belief is characterized not as a thought, but as an action . . . the faithful sufferer does not reevaluate her condition, but 'takes' it to God for transformation. Objectively, the faithful sufferer remains in a grievous condition; subjectively, the faithful sufferer has, through 'thanksgiving', received God's blessing (122-3).

Relying on Kierkegaard's characterization of faith as a paradoxical combination of 'resignation' and faith, Hough seems to suggest that the 'objective' and the 'subjective' are "paradoxically" reconciled in faith. What does this mean? Hough offers the insufficiently explained conception of "moving through the world" (see, for example, 124, 125). I suppose that by this she means to suggest that faith amounts to the practical attitude the believer has with respect to the world: he is "confident in the world's abundance, secure in his practice of faith, which turns on a central premise: 'Every good and every perfect gift is from above'" (142). However, this does not explain much. Returning to the difficult example of a believer who has lost a child: Hough would have him consider the loss as both an inconsolable disaster and a good and perfect gift, both a "grievous condition" and a "blessing". But what does it really mean to be in such a state -- not just intellectually, but also emotionally? What motivates such a person as he "moves through the world"?

Maybe Hough means that the believer is motivated by his ability to trust the ultimate goodness of human existence -- even if all available evidence stands against such a judgment. But if this is what she means, then she should have been clearer with regard to the idea of transforming. Faith (I would say) does not 'transform' suffering and loss into 'blessings' -- the loss of a child cannot be conceived as a "good gift" under any circumstances -- but rather allows the believer to endure suffering in a special way. Only as a believer, who trusts the ultimate goodness of the life bestowed on him as "a good and perfect gift", he will be justified in his hope to find joy in this life again and, accordingly, be able to affirm it as nevertheless valuable.[3] Thus, unlike Hough who claims that "Life . . . is suffering" (141), I would say that indeed life entails suffering, but also joy -- and neither side invalidates the other. Human life is not a dichotomy of (objective) suffering and (subjective) joy: it is a unification of suffering and joy. This what makes life tragic. And faith, in my understanding, is the best way to address it as such.

Regardless of these reservations, Hough deserves praise for bringing forcefully to the fore the real challenge involved in any attempt to affirm the value of human existence. An ardent advocacy of Kierkegaard, Hough's book reflects an impressive mastery of his corpus. And here lies, in my view, the strongest point of this study. Hough takes the relatively marginal 'tax collector' and puts him into productive dialogue with other Kierkegaardian protagonists such as the aesthete and Judge William. Moreover, she fills critical gaps in his characterization, most significantly with regard to his becoming the joyful-by-faith person that he is. Connecting this crucially to sin confirms the account of faith offered in Fear and Trembling as no less valid than later, (supposedly) more Christianly committed, Kierkegaardian accounts of faith. This is a considerable strengthening of the important (but controversial) scholarly view that conceives of Kierkegaard's authorship as a unified whole.

Hough's devotion to Kierkegaard has a weaker side, however, and this concerns her inclination to embrace his views uncritically. The philosopher is quoted extensively, often unquestioningly, and Hough allows him to delimit the frame of discussion -- thus leaving his ideas largely expressed in his terms, without enough justification. Moreover, Hough consciously echoes Kierkegaard's literary devices and idiosyncratic formulations. This attests the author's literary talent, but may sometimes give the impression that rather than serving to advance the discussed ideas, the style itself is in the spotlight.

To conclude, this readable book vigorously asks the right (and difficult) questions, and does so in a way which intentionally diverges from more conventional philosophical discussion. Those who are not familiar with Kierkegaard's thought might well find the book an exciting initiation to his philosophical world, while those who are already acquainted with it might well benefit from such lively access to some of his central ideas. At the end of the book Hough "ardently wish[es]" her reader to permit her words (as she puts it) "to stand in the spirit she offers them" (159). I'm not entirely sure what she means by that, but I'm certain that readers who find their inspiration in a more evocative contemplation of Kierkegaard's ideas, and consider stylistic playfulness a productive approach to his thought, would find satisfaction and enjoyment in this book.

[1] Although he is obviously not a tax collector but only looks like one. Hough indeed acknowledges the difference, but does not clearly justify her choice to call him thus. See pp. 9-10.

[2] As she uses these terms interchangeably, I gather that Hough takes them to be equivalent.

[3] See my Kierkegaard on Faith and Love, Cambridge University Press, 2009, chapter 3. See also John Davenport's excellent 'Faith as Eschatological Trust in Fear and Trembling', in Ethics, Love, and Faith in Kierkegaard: Philosophical Engagements, ed. E. F. Mooney, Indiana University Press, 2008.