Kierkegaard's God and the Good Life

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Stephen Minister, J. Aaron Simmons, and Michael Strawser (eds.), Kierkegaard's God and the Good Life, Indiana University Press, 2017, 272pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253029249.

Reviewed by David Lappano, Centre for Christian Studies, Winnipeg, Canada


This book brings together a thoughtfully curated collection of essays that offers Kierkegaard as an important resource for anyone thinking through the intersection of religion, ethics, and social life in twenty-first century contexts. And, of course, one is not surprised that navigating this particular intersection also involves rich engagements with philosophy and literature.

The collection identifies two specific sites that have come to regard "the relationship between moral action and thinking about God as deeply problematic." The first site is Kierkegaardian scholarship where, Stephen Minister, J. Aaron Simmons, and Michael Strawser note, there is a growing tendency to read Kierkegaard's work "as a challenge to theism, rejecting classical modes of transcendence," and which "offers new ways of inhabiting the world after the 'death of God'" (ix). They suspect that this trend serves to make Kierkegaard appear more relevant to the fields of philosophy and religious studies, which don't necessarily adhere to Christian doctrinal assumptions.

The second site is the non-academic sphere of public discourse and experience where the intersection between religious existence and social life is not waning but is just as prescient as ever. We are reminded of the global prominence of Pentecostalism, "renewed interest in Catholicism," "increased attention to the dynamics of Islam," and even some apparent 'religious' aspects found within various expressions and practices of new atheist movements (ix). All of this is reason to consider Kierkegaard's contributions to modern life "not despite his religious commitments, but precisely because of them" (ix).

It might seem that this motivation places the volume in a group of other scholarly attempts from the twentieth century that wish to suggest Kierkegaard is only intelligible as a theologian and, therefore, it is those who share such theological commitments who are best equipped to expound the Dane's enduring relevance. But that is in fact not the purpose of this collection. The authors are not concerned to demonstrate that the broad and innovative reassessments of Kierkegaard beyond doctrinal theology are in any way unfounded. This book is not a critique of those readings. Instead this volume insists it will "think in conversation with such new directions in Kierkegaard scholarship and [it will] offer reasons to think that there are no simple answers when it comes to understanding Kierkegaard's complex, theologically oriented authorship and its ethical impact" (ix-x). The emphasis is really on an analysis of Kierkegaard's texts for the purpose of social insight and application today, especially for those who are religiously interested in Kierkegaard's contribution to the good life.

The volume's three sections guide the reader thematically through Kierkegaard's ethical-religious concerns, which are otherwise dispersed among the pseudonyms and signed works and across the distinct periods of his authorship. Part 1 gathers chapters under the heading "Faith and Love", part 2 focuses on "Moral Psychology and Ethical Existence", and the final part presents chapters under the heading, "Existence Before God."

Appropriately, Sharon Krishek opens the first section with "Love as the End of Human Existence." Krishek has been a prominent voice in recent discussions that are refocusing and reassessing the nature and role of love in Kierkegaard's thought as a whole. This scholarship, which largely focuses on Works of Love, has significantly repositioned Kierkegaard as much more socially oriented than previously assumed. Here Krishek reflects on a passage near the end of Works of Love when Kierkegaard succinctly sums up his entire thesis: "To love people is the only thing worth living for . . . without this love you are not really living" (Works of Love, 375). Krishek wonders if we can discover the truth of this by considering its opposite. She asks, what it would look like "to live one's live while not really living it?" She suggests we can look to Tolstoy's Ivan Ilyich to discover a case study of someone whose life without love represents a life not really lived. Through an analysis of Kierkegaard and Tolstoy, Krishek shows how love is both the ground of our very being and our uniquely human task.

A great deal of attention in Kierkegaard studies is given to a reassessment of the role of love in Kierkegaard's overall philosophy. Much of this, unsurprisingly, focuses on Works of Love. Michael Strawser's "Love is the Highest Good," welcomes the recent attention paid to love in Kierkegaard's work, but he wants to remind readers how works of love are connected to purity of heart and willing the Highest Good. This connection in Kierkegaard has by no means been regarded as obvious, as Strawser points out with reference to Louis Mackey and Roe Fremstedal. Beginning with Upbuilding Discourses in Various Spirits (published within months of Works of Love) and then taking the reader through several pseudonymous and signed works, Strawser argues that the highest good is neither shaped by virtue nor guilt but "an active state . . . that expresses love for another person" (26). Strawser does not feel the need to sort out how love for God and love for neighbours can both be the highest good, but this is precisely the kind of ambiguity or paradox that is understood to be religiously generative rather than intellectually stifling.

There are five chapters that deal directly with Kierkegaard's unique insights into various ways of knowing, and which take the reader beyond the conventional 'truth as subjectivity' angle often associated with Kierkegaardian epistemology. Pia Søltoft pays tribute to the erotic wisdom of Kierkegaardian love. Here 'erotic' signifies a commitment to embodied expressions of love and it signifies desire -- the desire of God for creation and the desire of creatures for God. Søltoft's chapter also rejects the strong dualism and division between eros and agapē that Kierkegaard is often assumed to support. Instead we get a more nuanced understanding of how love works through need and gift, human and divine expressions, surplus and limit.

John J. Davenport also explores the possible connections between agapic love and preferential loves. He explores the notion of infusion -- how every special love can be 'infused' with neighbour love. Recognizing that Kierkegaard's unsystematic approach does leave some unanswered questions regarding the relationship between special loves and agapic love, Davenport introduces Dietrich von Hildebrand to the discussion and suggests that Hildebrand's notion of 'Caritas' might help us understand the infusion Kierkegaard points to.

Love is the theme du jour in Kierkegaard studies because it is a bridge concept/experience; it resembles faith. Mark A. Tietjen adds moral knowledge to this discussion, suggesting there is something faith-like in the 'desire' to establish and know that all people ought to be treated equally. Tietjen brings Simone Weil into conversation with Kierkegaard on the question of moral knowledge and divine self-limitation. What Tietjen calls 'agapic moral fideism' is "the view that truly to act as one ought to act in relation to others, one must do so trustingly, even though one cannot know with apodictic certainty that one is acting as one ought (or that there is a way that one ought to act in the first place)" (88). Tietjen anchors this to Kierkegaard's claim that the loving one must presuppose love in the other. The strength of this chapter is its depiction of how moral responsibility resembles a kind of fideism, that it requires faith.

John Lippitt leads us into a conversation about how humility and gratitude connect with contentment and joy in Kierkegaard's 'upbuilding discourses' literature. Since, for Kierkegaard, these virtues are "rooted in a picture of a God who forgives," developing these virtues is a religious practice. Kierkegaard can coach people, like a spiritual director, towards liberation from "the power that worry has to overwhelm us" (108) and then help us see how we can direct gratitude and joy outward to others.

Rick Anthony Furtak explores how loving and knowing are "essentially synonymous" (116). Rather than a common philosophical-scientific approach that regards interestedness and passion and emotion as comportments that distort truth, Furtak, with Kierkegaard, offers these as legitimate ways of knowing, especially of an ethical understanding of what has value.

Any serious attempt to examine the social reality of our time must account for our digital landscapes and virtual societies. To that end Christopher B. Barnett offers "From Hegel to Google: Kierkegaard and the Perils of 'the System'". Barnett takes Kierkegaard's philosophy of passion and suspicion of disinterested objectivity and applies that to an analysis of Google -- or, more precisely, an analysis of the modern human (social-ethical) experience as it is mediated by Google. According to Barnett, Hegel and Google "stand in an analogous relation to one another: both promote the systematic collection and distribution of knowledge at the expense of concrete human flourishing" (130). Drawing mostly on Johannes Climacus' critique of Hegel, Barnett challenges Google's assumption that making more and more information available to more and more people is more useful (138). Barnett utilizes Kierkegaard to expose technology as ideology and Google as the 'high church of the internet'. But Barnett also recognizes that Kierkegaard offers a kind of therapy of contemplation (not to be confused with mindfulness) for those wishing to avoid total absorption into the 'system'.

In a collection that undoubtedly affirms applications of Kierkegaard's thought to the social-moral questions of our time, a very important contribution comes from one of the editors, Stephen Minister, whose essay implores us to remain vigilant against some tendencies within Kierkegaard's works and their reception toward a devaluation of the finite, historical, and human claims for justice when uncritical emphasis is placed on the infinite, the eternal, and love's abstract subject -- the neighbour. Minister revisits and reminds readers of Levinas' critique of Kierkegaard. He does so not to repeat the discussion but to caution Kierkegaardians not to overlook the areas of Kierkegaard's ethical claims which appear to be disconnected from concrete historical realities -- because concrete responsibilities ought to be attached to those realities.

Edward F. Mooney takes us through a discussion of faith's commitment to the difficulties of existence. Mooney's prose invites us into the lyrical style of Kierkegaard's pseudonyms, where faith is presented indirectly as something to be searched for, struggled for, cherished, and luring. Rather than the common and naïve presentation of faith as an escape or denial of reality, Mooney shows how faith for Kierkegaard is fortitude, how it empowers people to stick with existence, and yet acknowledges vulnerability, contingency, and trust -- which is found in an intricate relationship between oneself, others, and God.

The issue of how knowledge relates to the good life returns in the book's final section. Here, M. G. Piety explores "Kierkegaard and the Early Church on Christian Knowledge and Its Existential Implications." This chapter highlights Kierkegaard's consonance with the epistemology of Irenaeus and Clement of Alexandria. While affirming Kierkegaard's doctrinal orthodoxy, Piety insists that Kierkegaard's epistemology is not cognitivist. Instead, it is rooted in more existential categories of encounter and relationship. Knowledge for living comes through God's instruction and through encountering Christ with the eyes of the soul (202-203). Piety connects Clement's understanding of gnosis with the existentialism of Kierkegaard. Both emphasize the process or task of becoming the truth, of the truth as the way rather than a result to possess or observe (203). An obvious connection is made to theosis and theophany. Ultimately, for Piety, Christian knowledge attends to a certain formula: "To meet Christ . . . in the passion of faith, is to come to know that God is love, that love is a living, dynamic force, not a mere fact, and that Christian truth is a way of living rather than a set of propositions" (204).

In "Thunderstruck: Divine Irony in Kierkegaard's Job," Grant Julin draws attention to a figure in Kierkegaard's writing who is largely overlooked in favour of Abraham, Socrates, or Christ. Kierkegaard's various treatments of Job are explored alongside Kierkegaard's assessment of Irony. The puzzle of Job is that he is able to hold two contradictory positions together: that both he and God are in the right. And it is Job's ability to cling to this paradox that allows him to persist through his ordeal. For Julin this paradox is not solely the paradox of faith, but it is a paradoxical consciousness based in Kierkegaardian irony. Julin asks what kind of Irony Job exhibits, and how it is ethically and existentially instructive. Guiding the reader through analysis of Repetition and Concept of Irony, Julin demonstrates how Job comes to a place of 'positive irony' which accepts the absurdity of existence but also commits oneself to ethical ideals. For Kierkegaard, Job is developed and deepened in and through his ridiculous ordeal. Job's is a tale, Julin explains, of how to defiantly conjure up freedom in situations (shall we say all of existence is such a situation) where we appear to be without. Its theme is emancipation rather than resignation.

The final chapter focuses on an aspect of Kierkegaard's theology that really only gets developed in the final years of his writing: pneumatology. This is an area that draws the interest of some scholars in the Pentecostal tradition. J. Aaron Simmons, one of the volume's editors, traces connections between Kierkegaard's later work and the contemporary Pentecostal philosophy of James K. A. Smith's notion of 'thinking in tongues' (227). Using the wine and sobriety stories in Acts and in For Self-Examination,` Simmons argues that, for Smith and Kierkegaard, Pentecost functions as a hermeneutic, a 'counterinterpretation' that exposes the weakness of worldly power and the frailty of worldly assurances. And Simmons goes so far as to suggest this hermeneutic of the spirit "indicates a veritable social revolution at the level of how to interpret society, truth, and power itself" (240). There are several places in Kierkegaard's corpus that hint at ideology critique and it is always left to readers today to try assembling such a theory. Simmons is right to draw our attention to the importance of For Self-Examination when considering a theological assessment of culture or ideology. A natural follow-up to this chapter would be comparative: how does this Kierkegaard-Pentecostal critique converse with or challenge the standard lineage of critical theory from Marx onward?

This collection offers creative and accessible essays that will surely broaden the application of Kierkegaard's thought in theology and social-moral thought. It primarily addresses the first half of its mandate: to respond to a discussion within Kierkegaard scholarship. The other half of the mandate -- to respond to the ongoing impact of religiousness outside the academy in multi-faith contexts -- remains underrepresented. With such an explosion of Kierkegaard scholarship these days it should have been possible to engage with more intercultural and international interpretations -- rather than solely ecumenical -- of Kierkegaard and the good life (only Krishek and Søltoft are situated outside the US or UK).

The essays in this volume will certainly generate further conversation and analysis of Kierkegaard's continued relevance for social-spiritual life. But perhaps its most important impact will be its ability to convey with openness and nuance the idea that love, much more than a warm, elating feeling, can actually facilitate social moral transformation.