Killing in War

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Jeff McMahan, Killing in War, Oxford UP, 2009, 250pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199548668.

Reviewed by Nick Fotion, Emory University



The main topic of this book is the doctrine of the moral equality of combatants as is found in traditional versions of just war theory. It is a topic that McMahan has written much about already.1 Among other things, what this doctrine tells us is that combatants fighting a just war and those fighting an unjust war have an equal right to kill.2 The Afrika Corp soldier fighting for Rommel and Hitler and the British 8th Army soldier fighting for Montgomery and Churchill can, as it were, shoot at each other as moral equals. Put this way the doctrine sounds bizarre. Yet many thinkers over the long history of just war theory suppose that the moral equality doctrine is not bizarre. Indeed, they think it makes sense and beyond that, is correct. McMahan sets out to show that the doctrine is dead wrong.

How so? The main tactic of those defending the doctrine is to point to similarities between the two sides. These similarities supposedly generate equality. Both sides (in a conventional war) wear uniforms, carry weapons, act on the commands of their officers, act as loyal members of the community, act to defend themselves once the shooting starts, and so on. Nevertheless, Mc Mahan tells us, when a soldier wears a uniform he has not consented to have soldiers on the other side shoot at him (54-56). Something more than uniform wearing is needed to make the shooting just. In uniform, a soldier can justly shoot at soldiers on the other side if those soldiers have crossed his country’s border without asking for and receiving permission from the soldier’s government. Uniformed enemy soldiers, however, cannot shoot at our soldier and claim that justice is on their side. The same argument applies to toting guns. Our soldier can use his gun with justice on his side when the enemy crosses the border, but enemy soldiers crossing the border cannot. Our soldier can shoot justly if commanded to do so, but when commanded the enemy soldiers cannot. So although the soldiers on both sides share much in common, they don’t share what is crucially important. Both do not have justice in their side.

Mc Mahan’s arguments, those on which I have reported and others he gives, are convincing. The doctrine just war thinkers should be following might better be stated as the moral inequality of combatants. That doctrine or one like it would, Mc Mahan tells us, do some good. Fighting under the banner of inequality (asymmetry), soldiers would realize that they need to do more than just follow the principles of discrimination and proportionality as is found in the in bello portion of just war theory. They would realize that they need justice on their side if they want to feel at ease morally. They would realize that they have a responsibility to the ad bellum portion of just war theory as well. That is, the inequality doctrine would encourage them to think more seriously about why their nation supposes it should go to war. In turn, that thinking might just encourage some to oppose a war that could, objectively speaking, turn out to be unjust.

But that is only part of the story. To understand the rest, one has to ask why the equality doctrine was put in place in our thinking about war in the first place. In large part, the answer is that this doctrine was created because of the concern about equal treatment of prisoners and equal treatment of combatants once they start heading home to their old civilian jobs after the war. The doctrine helped to justify policies that said, in effect, we should treat their prisoners the way we would want them to treat our prisoners, and we should treat their combatants once they have gone home the way we would want ours to be treated. Beyond that, we should even treat their civilians (now that we are occupying their country) the way we would wish our civilians to be treated had our country been occupied by a victorious enemy military machine.

Nevertheless if McMahan is right, as he surely is, the equality doctrine, being untrue, cannot justify anything. It cannot justify a policy of equal treatment on the in bello side of just war theory. On that side, the doctrine of moral inequality is of no help either, even if (as noted above) it is helpful on the ad bellum side. What is needed is a totally different doctrine, one that doesn’t speak to justifying some policy but speaks directly to the policy itself. One suggestion (not McMahan’s) is to call it the doctrine of equal treatment of combatants (and civilians). Of course that doctrine would need to be justified. We would have to be told why those who are fighting an unjust war should be treated pretty much the same way that we treat just fighters. That task of justification is not easy, but McMahan is helpful here. He tells us that some fighters on the unjust side have been coerced into fighting (115-118). The coercion often comes from the law that drafts those who are unwilling to enter the military. At other times it comes from the society in general. Young potential recruits are pressured by the media, friends and family to join up “to serve your country”. Once in the military, coercion comes from those who have rank over those who have no or little rank. Often, as well, the various forms of coercion work together. However it works on a young person, coercion plays an excusing role. If in fact the coercion is severe enough, we are tempted to say of those who are coerced that they are blameless for carrying out orders to kill enemy soldiers in the course of battle.

Being excused does not make soldiers (combatants) who are fighting an unjust war equal morally to those who are fighting a just war. They are, after all, still unjust warriors. But it does make them more or less equivalent, thus making it easier to argue for the application of the doctrine of equal treatment. These unjust but excused combatants are supposed to be treated in much the same way that we would want our just combatants to be treated were they to fall into enemy hands.

McMahan identifies a second group of excusing conditions that can encourage a nation to accept the equal treatment doctrine. He places these conditions under the heading of epistemic limitation (119-121). Combatants are often ill educated, ill informed or manipulated by their government’s propaganda machine. McMahan identifies a third group of excusing conditions. This legalistic sounding group he labels diminished responsibility (122). Combatants suffering from temporary or not-so-temporary insanity fall within this grouping. Those who are immature would be included here as well (although they might also fall under the epistemic limitation heading). Presumably many combatants fall under more than one heading and subheading. They are coerced in more than one way, they also are moved by various forms of social pressure, are ill educated, immature and perhaps a little crazy. So there are many excusing conditions, working either singly or together, to create a portrait of a military organization whose personnel are excused for fighting in an unjust war. McMahan’s discussion of these excusing conditions is both detailed and systematic.

One other consideration should be mentioned in so far as it leads to “equal” treatment. This consideration has nothing to do with excusing the combatants. Instead it has to do with the just and winning nation (or coalition of nations) putting the defeated nation back together again. With that goal in mind, it would not do for the winners to spend time and effort judging the (unjust) behavior of the losers. Extensive trials and hearings would delay the reconciliation that is needed if the defeated nation is to be reconstituted. Of course some would have to be tried. Those few who engaged in egregious crimes would be treated as criminals and, if found guilty, punished accordingly. The vast majority of the combatants, who by some standards are murderers, would nonetheless be released to go home to their families, to their civilian work, or back to school.

In his last chapter McMahan extends his analysis to civilians. Civilians, like combatants, should be treated asymmetrically. Attacks on civilians whose government is fighting a just war are almost universally unjust. Attacks on the unjust society’s civilians are also unjust but now various exceptions are possible. Those civilians who in one way or another are responsible for the war can be harmed. They might be attacked militarily but, more than likely, the harm would come some other way. They might suffer the loss of property or they might suffer from sanctions imposed on their nation. How they might be harmed is all a matter of degree since civilian involvement in war is also a matter of degree.

At this point McMahan discusses various levels and types of complicity. For example, he wonders how complicit Israeli settlers are when they, and the group they are with, forcefully eject Palestinians from homes they have occupied for several generations. How complicit are those civilians who work in so called dual-use factories that make boots for soldiers and for ordinary workers? How complicit are workers in a munitions factory? Also, how complicit are those who support and vote for the political party that is looking to start an unjust war? Beyond the issue of the level of complicity is a question of how to respond to the various forms of complicity. It all sounds very complicated.

At the very end of his last chapter McMahan has a brief discussion of civilian liability and terrorism. He notes here that what he says earlier about allowing attacks on certain civilians sounds disturbingly like what terrorists say. These terrorists claim that they are not attacking innocents when, for example, they blow up British citizens engaged in their London commute. They certainly don’t think of themselves as attacking innocents when they attack Israeli young people who are relaxing in a Jerusalem coffee shop.

When all is said and done, Jeff McMahan has given those interested in military ethics a book that deserves praise. Not all parts of the book are reader friendly. Early on, his writing is quite abstract and not especially supported by examples to help make what he is saying clear. As he warms to his task, and as his use of examples becomes more frequent, his writing becomes clearer. Clear or not, however, McMahan’s writing is always informative, systematic and well-organized. The rich collection of distinctions that he provides makes this book well-worth reading carefully.

1 Among McMahan’s writings are: “On the Moral Equality of Combatants”, Journal of Political Philosophy, 2006, 14, 4, pp. 377-393; “Collectivist Defenses of the Moral Equality of Combatants”, Journal of Military History, 2007, 6, 1, pp. 50-59.

2 See also the following recent works: Andrew Sola, “The Enlightened Grunt? Invincible Ignorance in the Just War Tradition”, Journal of Military History, 2009, 8, 1, pp. 48-65; Michael Walzer, Just and Unjust Wars, Basic Books, 1977; Roger Wertheimer “Reconnoitering Combatant Moral Equality”, Journal of Military History, 2007, 6,1, pp. 60-74; Dan Zupan “The Logic of Community, Ignorance, and the Presumption of Moral Equality”, Journal of Military History, 2007, 6, 1, pp. 41-49.