Kindness and the Good Society: Connections of the Heart

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Hamrick, William S., Kindness and the Good Society: Connections of the Heart, State University of New York Press, 2002, 318pp, $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 0791452662.

Reviewed by Neera K. Badhwar, University of Oklahoma


With its 318 pages of fine print, William Hamrick’s Kindness and the Good Society may be the most exhaustive study of the nature and importance of human kindness ever written, and certainly the most exhaustive philosophical study. Hamrick thinks that kindness has not received even a modicum of the attention it deserves, despite its centrality in a good human life. Accordingly, he leaves no question about kindness – and few discussions of it – untouched. As the 17 pages of bibliography and 8 pages of index quickly reveal, Hamrick makes extensive use of philosophy (mostly contemporary, but from both sides of what may be called the Continental divide), fiction and, to a lesser extent, the other arts and the social sciences, to frame, illustrate, or support his discussion, deftly weaving the rich variety of sources into a coherent whole.

The result, especially in Part I, is an almost encyclopedic survey and analysis of literature relevant to kindness, often fascinating in its detail, but also often leaving the reader impatient for the “punch line” delivering the author’s thesis and his argument for it. Although Hamrick is a remarkably clear writer and always returns to the point, one could wish that he – or his editor – had pruned some of the detail that intrudes between his introduction of an issue and his resolution of it. Following him to the end is made harder by the fact that his discussion of other thinkers relies heavily on quotations, so that often it seems that the chapter is about them rather than about the issue itself. This is a pity, because the book is eminently worth reading for its rich and insightful exploration of the many faces of kindness and unkindness.

In the Introduction, Hamrick announces his intention to use Merleau-Ponty’s phenomenological method – the method of using the pre-philosophical experience we acquire as embodied subjects in living our lives (xix-xx). His central task, he says, is to reach an understanding that is philosophical but “distilled from reflections actively engaged with our times” because the use of reason and the meaning of timeless truths is influenced by the layers of meaning deposited in the culture in which we live (xviii).

Part I is devoted to a description of the phenomena of kindness in order to grasp their essences, their “unique manner of existing” (Merleau-Ponty) as a unity of matter and form, particular and universal (xx). Thus, Hamrick devotes the first three chapters to a description and analysis of kindness in an interpersonal context: acts as well as omissions of kindness (the tactful aversion of the eyes to save someone embarrassment) and kindness as a character trait. The latter involves four main qualities (chapters 2 and 3): a disposition to perform kind acts that is both habitual and active, in that it makes us alert to the need for kindness, a spirit of “warm generosity” rather than a cold or mechanical (or, I would add, reluctant) charity, and self-withdrawal.

Chapter 3 is devoted to a discussion of self-withdrawal and related concepts. Self-withdrawal is best understood through the notion of “self-transposal” – the imaginative grasp of another’s thoughts and feelings by taking the other person’s place in order to make kind interventions (64). But the attempt at self-transposal can turn into an “invasion and occupation” of the other’s self, where one views her through one’s own values and frame of reference – and thereby fails to truly understand her and treat her kindly (67). Self-withdrawal also requires a limitation on how long one remains in the other’s emotional space. Genuine self-transposal requires “an appropriate type of presence as well as absence of self” (68). And the former requires a limitation on, or withdrawal of, the agent’s own frame of reference in the attempt to take another’s place. The “totalizer” is present too much, so to speak, the “colonizer” too long, and the “officious do-gooder,” presumably, both too much and too long. On the other hand, the cold-hearted individual who cannot see beyond his own narrow concerns is an example of someone who is inappropriately absent. The kind person, in contrast to all these, successfully engages in the dialectical process that enables her to achieve “both distance and closeness, proximity and tactful differentiation, compassionate intervention and appropriate withdrawal” (68-9).

For those who, like this reviewer, are more familiar with Aristotle than with phenomenology, it is illuminating to see the foregoing passage as a thick description of what it means for kindness to hit the mean by getting it just right in aim, manner, time, and emotion, and for the corresponding vices to miss the mean through excess or deficiency in one or more of these aspects.

Hamrick identifies empathy as the emotion that enables the kind person to hit the mean, calling it “the crucial epistemological hinge on which kindness turns” (79). In empathy, one vicariously participates in another’s joy or sorrow while retaining the distinction between that other and oneself (75-9). Hamrick follows Max Scheler and Edith Stein in arguing that empathy is different from “emotional contagion” (the sort of phenomenon we see in nurseries when one crying baby starts a whole chorus of crying babies) as well as from emotional identification with another (78-9). Both of these are involuntary emotions in which the boundaries between self and other are blurred (contagion) or lost (identification). In these emotions, then, one becomes another, whereas in empathy and, thus, kindness, one knows another.

This is a crucial distinction, but for readers who find it elusive it may help to consider that even the narcissist can become another without knowing or, therefore, empathizing with, that other. In identifying with another’s grief, the narcissistic individual’s focus of attention becomes her own grief. Unlike the empathic individual, who comforts Alpha in her grief, the narcissistic individual seeks comfort for herself because she is grieved by Alpha’s grief. For the narcissist, Alpha is not a full-fledged subject, a center of experience in his own right, but a moment in the narcissist’s own life-narrative. As far as the narcissist is concerned, there is only one point of view, her own, and one center of experience, herself. Hence, what she grieves over is not Alpha but her own grief in Alpha’s grief.

In stating that the role of empathy in kindness makes kindness “a way of knowing the other as other,” Hamrick underscores the fundamental premise of his discussion throughout the book, namely, that emotions are not merely conative, but also cognitive, states, a premise that has in recent years been well substantiated by psychologists and philosophers. As we have already seen, empathy involves judgments about the right kind and amount of presence and absence in the other’s life. Further, empathy “presupposes interpretive judgments” about the other’s “Lifeworld” and how he perceives it (80). These two sets of judgments are partly constitutive of empathy. But to truly help people out of kindness we must supplement empathy with judgments about the appropriateness of their feelings, their anxieties or sorrows. In Aristotelian language again, the kind person hits the mean in passion and action because he has practical wisdom.

Hamrick follows his discussion of interpersonal kindness with two chapters on kindness as “a social phenomenon” (95). Ch. 4 evaluates the kindness or unkindness of the value-laden “social atmospheres” or zeitgeists “that shape our perception of the social world,” especially with regard to technology and nature (95-6). These social atmospheres or “horizons of meaning” are “everywhere (accepted) and nowhere (explained or defended, except in times of social upheaval and crisis)” (97). Hence, he states, they cannot be attributed to anyone other than the community as a whole or (in G.H. Mead’s words) to “the generalized other” (97).

However, although it is true that widely accepted assumptions must be attributed to the generalized other, is it not also often the case that their origin and survival can be attributed to particular others? Often there are identifiable individuals or institutions in the “front lines” of advocacy or defense, without whose voice the assumptions might seep out of the social consciousness, perhaps under the weight of contrary assumptions held by others. This is especially so in contemporary America, where no opinion is so bizarre that it cannot attract a community of followers and create a social atmosphere in opposition to a prevailing atmosphere.1 The result is that, with respect to most issues, we have a plurality of zeitgeists, a fact that further complicates the already complicated issue of moral evaluation of zeitgeists (what is the “American” zeitgeist regarding animals – or pornography?).

An important area of concern in Ch. 4 is economic values and practices. Unfortunately, Hamrick takes certain currently fashionable judgments about American economic practices for granted, and evaluates them for their kindness or unkindness (mostly unkindness) on the basis of these judgments. Thus, we are told, the ratio of work to leisure for Europeans is much more satisfactory and, therefore, “kinder”, than for Americans (100-1). But he never questions the assumption that more leisure is better, much less more legally enforced leisure. He does say that a major value of leisure lies in providing opportunities for volunteerism (101), the rhetorical implicature being that there is less volunteerism in America than in Europe. Yet all the evidence suggests that volunteerism is far more widespread in America than in any European country, where the welfare state has taken over many of the services here provided by volunteers.2 Nor does Hamrick ever note the kindness of low unemployment and low inflation in America and the unkind reversal of this state of affairs in Europe.

Hamrick also repeats the oft-made criticism that Americans are the greatest “gluttons” of energy (119), as though our energy were a globally-baked pie from which we unfairly grabbed the largest slice, instead of something that we have either produced ourselves or bought from other producers (whose enterprises we have often helped develop). Nor does he acknowledge that America’s tremendous scientific and material creativity due to its “gluttony” makes countless lives abroad, especially in the third world, kinder and gentler through the transfer of ideas and technology. The Green Revolution, which has saved millions of people in the third world, thanks to the biogenetics research of the Nobel Peace Prize winner, Norman Borlaug, and India’s prosperous “Silicon Valley,” thanks to American computer technology, are only two small examples of this. This is not to say that all is well in the world of international energy, where dictators control vast supplies of oil, and there are dark intimations of force and fraud. But it’s not this that Hamrick deplores, it’s American consumption.

Hamrick’s discussion of how to evaluate technology is more successful. But how can we tell if a beneficial product was produced for the sake of benefiting us or entirely out of self-interest (106)? Usually, Hamrick points out, we can extrapolate from “the intelligent design, durability, and quality of certain products to the conclusion that someone, even though self-interested, actually cared about the fate of those using the technology,” and conversely, with unreliable or otherwise shoddy products.

The point about extrapolation is well taken, but it seems a stretch to call all acts or products meant to benefit others “kind,” rather than simply “benevolent” or “expressive of fellow-feeling.” “Kindness” involves helping others, but it is hard to think of joke books, kites, board games, or musical instruments as produced for the sake of helping people. Moreover, Hamrick’s taxonomy of possible motives for producing material goods – kindness or self-interest – is far too narrow and far too oppositional. First, many of the motivations for material creation are no different from those for intellectual or artistic creation, viz., to do the work one enjoys, to face and meet challenges, to give shape to an idea or vision. It is by investing ourselves in the things (and people) we love that we satisfy the desire to express ourselves, to live actively in the world. And it is by doing this that we create and re-create our selves. These motivations in themselves stem neither from the desire to benefit others nor from the desire to benefit oneself (although they are usually compatible with both). Second, self-interest itself can be wide enough to include an interest in benefiting others and (as philosophers in the eudaimonistic tradition saw), in a happy life it does include this.

Hamrick is good at weaving his way through the ambiguous effects of technology: the same object may be good for some, bad for others, and technology can alter our relationship with nature for both good and bad. Again, we can be unkind to nature, but nature can also be unkind to us, not only in the usual sense of harming us physically, but (more interestingly) in an indirect moral sense, as when it evokes unkindness from us (we can just be naturally prone to finding certain personalities irritating or aversive, despite our good intentions and genuine efforts to overcome these reactions) (128).

In Ch. 5 Hamrick discusses the way institutions and communities create opportunities for both kindness and unkindness, and how institutional contexts make it hard to determine if an act is genuinely kind or simply a professional performance without the motivations necessary to kindness. This paves the way for a “hermeneutics of suspicion” in Part II.

The hermeneutic challenge is to see whether what seems like kindness, even to the agent, really is kindness, or just a self-deceptive mask for other unsavory motives. Hermeneutics reveals the hidden motives and meanings of people’s actions, thus “destabilizing” the appearances; however, it does this not as an end in itself, but for ultimate “redemption” of the phenomena by preparing the ground for a better understanding of them (174). Accordingly, chs. 6 and 7 proceed to sow philosophical discord with the help of the three great theorists of suspicion, Nietzsche, Marx, and Freud, and ch. 8 to bring harmony by effecting a synthesis of description and skeptical questioning to attain a deeper understanding of kindness and its value.

Ch. 6 shows how alleged acts of kindness often mask the desire for power. We see this with patriarchal husbands who treat their wives like dolls, or slave-owners who invite the slaves to drink freely every Christmas, ostensibly out of the “goodness of their hearts,” but in actuality, to engender gratitude for their “kindness” and show the subsequently hung-over and disgusted slaves that the freedom to do whatever they like is not necessarily good for them (185). Through these “kindnesses,” the husbands and the slave-owners reinforce their power over their subjects. In these criticisms Hamrick is on firm ground. Not so, however, when he uncritically adopts R.D. Laing’s theories to berate the parents of schizophrenic children for their alleged masked unkindness. Any one-size-fits-all explanation of psychological problems is simplistic, but in addition, Laing’s view has been challenged by the brain-disease theory as well as other theories of schizophrenia, including the theory that the causes of schizophrenia are still unknown.3

Hamrick then turns to Nietzsche’s view that all kindness is suspect. Like other Christian virtues, kindness, on Nietzsche’s view, is a mask for ressentiment and a tool of the weak to gain power over the strong (187-90). Not surprisingly, like Max Scheler before him, Hamrick rejects this view. He links Paul Ricoeur’s notion of the capable body to Martha Nussbaum’s notion of basic human capabilities and functionings and uses both to argue that genuine kindness stems from an inner strength, including the strength to resist opportunities for exercising power over others, and a sense of the worth of one’s life (190-97). A life of kindness is also creative (ch. 7). In all these ways, the genuinely kind person’s psychology, he argues, is akin to that of Nietzsche’s ideal, the “Overman.”

Ch. 7 discusses and evaluates the Marxist critique of capitalism as just another ideology and phenomenon of false consciousness concealing a bid for class power. Hamrick acknowledges that capitalism (which he equates with the free-market system) is the only viable economic-political system today, but complains that capitalism treats “nature and human beings as mere means to ends of exploitation and greed,” with the developing world being the chief victim of exploitation, as it is “plundered for cheap labor…and for raw materials” (200).

Unfortunately, Hamrick bases his case entirely on Marxist-socialist analyses, without considering free-market theorists’ explanations of apparent or real injustices, or their fundamental contention that if capitalism is equated with a free-market economy, then our economy is only more-or-less capitalistic. Be that as it may, they could agree that natural resources are sometimes exploited in ecologically unsound and aesthetically insensitive ways. But is this wrong when there is no alternative to saving lives, as is surely sometimes the case? (And even when there is, is it not odd to lump nature and people together as the “victims” of exploitation?) Again, free-market theorists would agree that Western companies pay workers in developing countries far less than workers at home (though far more than indigenous businesses). But could they pay more without having to close shop, thereby leaving the workers unemployed or employed on far lower wages (as has already happened in some cases, under protests from activists in the West)? And if not, are these businesses unjustly exploiting or actually benefiting their workers? Even more importantly, why are people in these countries so desperately poor in the first place – because of capitalism or because of its lack? Hamrick indicts capitalism for its “inherent injustices” without asking these difficult questions.

Again, to single out capitalism for criticism is to suggest that whatever injustices exist under it are worse than under other systems (which calls into question Hamrick’s belief that it is the only viable system). But in this post-Communist world of global travel and global television, this argument is impossible to make: the brutality, poverty, and environmental degradation of communist, theocratic, military, socialist, or feudal regimes is only too well known, and even democratic but (largely) non-capitalist (un-free-market) India fares much worse on liberty, equality, and overall well-being than any (largely) capitalist country. To be sure, there are legitimate criticisms to be made of mutually corrupting business-government (not to mention union-government and NGO-government) alliances that have replaced the unholy Church-government alliances of former years. But these are criticisms not of free markets (or free associations) but of their lack, and only free-market theorists criticize all such alliances for the inherent injustice of the political-economic favoritism they generate (subsidies, tariffs, politicization of research et al).

The unkindest cut of all in Hamrick’s hermeneutics of suspicion, however, is his description of American charitable acts as “almost cynical gestures around major holidays, when the capitalist conscience appears to be at its uneasiest” (201) and his analogizing of capitalism to slavery for creating “a fertile field for…illusions of goodness” (204). No doubt many give to assuage a sense of guilt, and many have an illusory belief in their own goodness. But where is the argument for supposing that this is especially true under capitalism? Perhaps, as Nietzsche thought, it is Christianity that encourages the guilt and the illusion, although one would have to do a comparative study of religions and cultures to say so confidently. Further, what supports the innuendo that many of those who feel guilty are not also genuinely concerned, or that the giving ceases with the holidays (201)? Since 1955 American private charity has grown steadily in real dollars (even in years of recession and even more in the so-called “decade of greed”), from $7.70 billion in 1955 to an incredible $212 billion in 2001, the second-highest total ever in real dollars, with 75.8% coming from individuals.4 All this from holiday guilt?

Hamrick’s valuable observations about the social construction of gender, both female and male, are also undercut by the simplistic explanation that the construction is meant to bestow power on “capitalist enterprises that trade on commodified bodies” (228). "Simplistic," because it ignores the well-known fact that many tribal and other non-capitalist cultures engage in far worse forms of commodification, especially of women, who are often traded in marriage according to the same criteria as cattle: their ability for reproduction and physical labor.

Examples like these show that a factually and theoretically under-informed hermeneutics of suspicion, one that sees “capitalist ideology” as the explanation for all (real or apparent) ills, can easily slip into injustice and - yes - an ideology that is both cynical and naïve. As a result, Hamrick never considers the possibility that his Marxist-socialist framework may itself be an ideology ripe for some Nietzschean unmasking.

The final chapter attempts to forge a conception of critical kindness in which decision making is more like that of an artist than that of a Kantian subject (243). This idea is akin to Aristotle’s conception of virtuous acts as kalos (fine, beautiful) in their complex balance of all relevant considerations and to his explicit invocation of craftsmanship in explaining his conception of a mean.

Hamrick’s insightful explorations of moral psychology here, as in the rest of the book, make an important contribution to what it means to lead a “non-naïve life of kindness as practical wisdom,” a life in which we are aware both of our own propensities to control others with our alleged kindnesses, and others’ propensities to exploit our genuine kindnesses (235). However, for reasons I have already discussed, the theoretical framework for his analysis of social-political unkindness and injustice, and his proposed social-political institutional remedies, are in need of the same hermeneutic scrutiny to which he subjects the theories and practices he rejects.


1. Consider PETA's campaign against The Tropicana Casino and Resort on behalf of the "dignity" of chickens. The casino allegedly "exploits" and "disrespects" chickens by making them play tic-tac-toe in one-hour shifts, without even ensuring that they get "quality downtime" with their families when they are not working ( and July 3, 2002).

2. In 1998 and 1999, 55.5% of American adults 18 and over volunteered an average of 24 hours per month in formal organizations alone; in 2000, the figure for adults 21 and over was 44% ( Presumably, the 2001 figures were the same as, or greater than, 2000. The dollar value of volunteer time (excluding informal volunteering) in 2001 is estimated at $248.8 billion. Figures for volunteering in Europe were unavailable.

3. Al Siebert, "Unethical Psychiatrists Misrepresent What is Known About Schizophrenia," The article first appeared in Journal of Ethical Human Sciences and Services (New York: Springer Publishing Company, Vol. 1, No. 2, Summer 1999), 179-89, as "Brain Disease Hypothesis for Schizophrenia Disconfirmed by All Evidence."

4. Giving USA 2002, AAFRC Trust for Philanthropy, Center on Philanthropy (Indiana University, IN, 2002).