Kinds, Things, and Stuff: Mass Terms and Generics

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Francis Jeffrey Pelletier (ed.), Kinds, Things, and Stuff: Mass Terms and Generics, Oxford UP, 2010, 223pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195382891.

Reviewed by Robert Fiengo, City University of New York



The essays in this book, Kinds, Things, and Stuff, derive from a conference that addressed the cognitive issues raised by ‘genericity’ and the ‘mass-count’ distinction. These terms, as commonly deployed, have labile applications: they might refer to things-in-the-world, to our conceptions of things-in-the-world, or to the linguistic expressions we use to refer to things-in-the-world. Hence they are a common source of confusion, and it is a great virtue of this volume that the papers it contains quite generally respect these distinctions. All of the papers are avowedly ‘psychological’ in their thrust: given that languages mark these distinctions formally, what can we infer about the conceptual distinctions, if such there be, that lie behind the formal distinctions? Indeed, how can the nature of human conceptualization be explored experimentally at all? Potentially, there is interplay between research on genericity and research on the mass-count distinction: one might hope that understanding the psychological underpinnings of the mass-count distinction would help us to appreciate how we conceptualize genericity and kinds. And what might understanding our appreciation of generic truth teach us about the distinction we make between stuff and individuals? Is the type-token distinction, fraught as it is, also part of the same mix? I think it is fair to say that these questions are not completely answered in the volume under review, but at least it must be said that similar issues arise in both of the chosen domains, and that understanding how to argue for the conceptual underpinnings of the one might easily transfer to our elucidation of the other. And the volume provides some strong hints along these lines. The editor of the volume, Francis Pelletier, provides insightful philosophical introductions to both topics; there are five papers on generics and three papers on the mass-count distinction. Let me take these in order.

Greg Carlson seeks to close the gap he perceives between formal semantics and psychology. Using the term ‘concept’ to refer to subjective properties of individual psyches, he considers what relation there might be between concepts, so defined, and the meanings of generic noun phrases. He makes use of the important observation that while bare plural generic noun phrases occur in unlimited complexity (e.g., ‘unpainted kitchen appliances’), definite singular generic noun phrases (e.g., ‘the elephant’) are much more restricted: contrast ‘the friendly elephant’, which lacks generic force. From this observation he arrives at the thought that definite singular generic noun phrases denote a kind if and only if the common noun denotes a concept (as ‘elephant’ is taken to do, but ‘friendly elephant’, not being a common noun, is not taken to do). This leads into some valuable speculation about natural kinds.

Sandeep Prasada asks the question of how, given our limited experience, we acquire generic knowledge. He reports on experimental work, pursued in a number of papers, in which he and his coauthors have distinguished between the properties a thing might have because it is that kind of thing and other properties a thing might have not for that reason: the ‘k-properties’ and the ‘t-properties’, respectively. This distinction helps to explain why subjects paraphrase ‘Dogs are four-legged’ as ‘Dogs are four-legged by virtue of being dogs’, but do not paraphrase ‘Barns are red’ as ‘Barns are red by virtue of being barns’, while accepting both that dogs are generally four-legged and that barns are generally red. On his view, our conceptual system represents ties between kinds and properties; one piece of this connection is expressed as the ‘Aspect Hypothesis’, according to which kinds are, with some disclaimers, sets of k-properties. This leads to a consideration of various kinds of kinds, and our conceptions of them.

Francis Pelletier reports on a series of experiments aimed at deciding whether bare-plural generic sentences such as ‘Birds fly’ have the ‘same generic force or meaning’ as ‘Most birds fly’ or ‘Birds usually fly’, and concludes that, in at least some experimental manipulations, the bare-plural formulation contains information different from that contained in the other two. The experiments involve subjects’ intuitions concerning the sort of default reasoning considered in Lifschitz (1989), an example being:

Birds fly.

Tweety and Polly are birds.

Polly doesn’t fly.

Therefore, Tweety flies.

Subjects apparently consider this argument more valid than one in which the first premise is replace by ‘Most birds fly’ or ‘Birds usually fly’, yet this does not settle the question whether a distinction Carlson has made between inductivist and rules-and-regularities approaches to genericity is vindicated. Nor does it settle the question whether bare plurals refer to kinds. Pelletier does well in laying these issues out.

James Hampton’s paper appeals to a version of ‘prototype theory’ to explicate vagueness and the instability of semantic judgments. He has experiments showing that being close to the center of a category underwrites more stable judgments of similarity to a prototype. And he has another set of experiments exploring the ‘modifier effect’, one of the consequences of which is that ‘Ravens are black’ is judged to be more true than ‘Feathered ravens are black’, which in turn is judged to be more true than ‘Jungle ravens are black’. These results, and others he mentions, are argued to derive from the fact that people represent concepts ‘in terms of a cluster of attributes that are typically true of the conceptual category’. A prototype need not be a visual image; what appears to be crucial is that people represent the ‘central tendencies of classes, not their boundaries’.

Susan Gelman provides a lucid description of the mysteries surrounding the child’s acquisition of generics. We learn that, despite the challenges posed by the expression of genericity in English, children make use of form-class cues to identify generics by the age of two and a half, and that, by the age of four, they produce generics as frequently as adults. And it is not that children are merely imitating: children actively initiate generic conversations. These observations, and others that derive from experiments Gelman reports on, lead to the suggestion that ‘children assume a conceptual distinction between generic and specific reference’. They ‘identify as generic those utterances that are not somehow marked specifically’. Generic interpretation, Gelman suggests, arises by default. This view appears to deny the popular conception that children are incapable of abstract thought, and has non-trivial implications for the acquisition of vocabulary.

The three papers on the mass terms begin with an effort by Cliff Goddard. He reports on work by Anna Wierzbicka pursuing the Natural Semantic Metalanguage system of lexical semantic representation. This approach allows for seven different subclasses of concrete mass nouns, examples of the classes being ‘cheese’, ‘wheat’, ‘dust’, ‘gravel’, ‘oats’, ‘coffee grounds’, and ‘noodles’. Among the considerations that lead to these distinctions is whether or not the referent has recognizable parts, and if so whether they are named, as in the case of ‘grain of wheat’, or not, as in the case of ‘gravel’, and whether the noun occurs in the plural (as ‘oats’ does, but not ‘wheat’). There are many descriptive fine points here worthy of consideration.

Edward Wisniewski reports on a variety of experiments all tending toward the view that there is a systematic relationship between speakers’ conceptualization of the things around them and the mass-count distinction. To select a few results, an experiment by Middleton et al. (2004) found that subjects were more likely to choose a count term to refer to the individuals of a novel aggregate if they had interacted with its members. Following a suggestion by Wierzbicka, it was found that when individuals in a collection are rather easily discriminated, it is rather more likely that count nouns will be deployed; mass nouns predominate when this is not so. And there are some very interesting comparisons between pluralia tantum nouns (e.g., ‘soapsuds’, ‘remains’, ‘scissors’, etc.) and collective terms and mass terms. The view that the distinction between mass and count terms tracks, if even roughly, the way speakers conceptualize the things to which they refer is given full voice in this valuable paper and supported by some straightforward experimentation.

The paper by Fei Xu investigates how the representation of sortal concepts develops in infancy and then argues against the traditional view that the words of infancy are fundamentally different from the words of adulthood. Research by Xu and Carey suggests that between the ages of ten and twelve months infants develop the capacity to use ‘property or sortal information to establish a representation of two distinct objects’. Twelve-month-old infants have been shown to be able to use the ‘presence of labels to determine how many object were in a box whose content was invisible to them’. It appears that infants expect count nouns to ‘refer to sortals/kinds, and that these representations support induction to new instances’. Xu argues that early words ‘refer to kinds, just like later words’.

A collection of essays dedicated to a particular topic succeeds in its task if the reader can read it and come out with a good idea of what the issues in that area amount to. A reader who is interested in genericity or in the mass-count distinction, who is interested also in how the experimental literature speaks to these concerns, will be well rewarded. And the reader who might specialize in psychology, or in philosophy of mind, who is curious how language-based experimentation can contribute to their interests, will also be rewarded. Thanks go to Francis Pelletier for putting these valuable essays together.