Know How

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Jason Stanley, Know How, Oxford University Press, 2011, 201pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199695362.

Reviewed by Kent Bach, San Francisco State University


It's been more than sixty years since Gilbert Ryle famously argued that knowing-how is different in kind from knowing-that.[1] Philosophers have tended to take this for granted ever since, though without the taint of Ryle's behaviorism. For several decades his dichotomy was challenged in the journals, but that did not keep it from having lasting influence in many areas of philosophy.[2] Whether philosophers accepted it on the basis of his arguments or just because it seemed obvious, most don't seem to have given much thought to what knowing-how is or why it should not be a case of knowing-that. Many may have just confused knowing how to do something with being able to do it. In any case, it took a provocative article by Jason Stanley and Timothy Williamson (2001) to rekindle the debate. They defended the "intellectualist" view that knowing-how is a kind of knowing-that, and many pro- and anti-intellectualist tracts have been published since.[3]

Stanley's rich and insightful new book develops and refines his earlier formulation of intellectualism. Indeed, he does a whole lot more, though not without leaving open some tough questions. He makes a powerful case for the view that knowing how to do something is to know, of a certain way, that one could do that thing in that way. But he says surprisingly little about what ways are, as if this is obvious. He is mainly concerned (in the first chapter) to rebut Ryle's and some recent anti-intellectualist arguments and (in the next four chapters) to refine his earlier strategy (with Williamson) of working from a semantic analysis of ascriptions of knowing-wh (-who, -where, etc., as well as -how). His analysis suggests that knowing-how is indeed a kind of knowing-wh and that knowing-wh in general is knowing-that: what you know when you know-wh is an answer to a wh-question, that is, a proposition that answers the question.[4] So knowing-how is just a case of knowing-that. However, according to Stanley, the sort of knowing-how underlying action does have certain special features. After presenting his account, he replies (in the last three chapters) to a number of objections, based on either linguistic, phenomenological, or cognitive-science considerations.

Stanley's defense of intellectualism is indirect and schematic. That is, he does not directly inquire into the nature of the cognitive states implicated in motor control, performance and performance errors, and practical expertise, all topics of substantial empirical research.[5] Stanley acknowledges that the conclusions he draws from his semantic analysis of ascriptions of knowing-how might not square with findings in cognitive science and that, perhaps, "work [in the cognitive sciences] shows that knowing how is the phlogiston of folk psychology" (p. 149). Assuming his account of knowing-how captures the folk psychological notion, it might turn out that the psychological states we describe as knowing-how either aren't propositional, as Stanley's account requires, or that they are not knowledge states at all.

Ryle used various regress arguments against intellectualism to motivate a dispositionalist account of knowing-how. In Chapter 1, "Ryle on Knowing How," Stanley refutes them. The main one assumes that for knowledge of a fact to play a role in action, it requires the prior performance of the distinct action of bringing that knowledge into consideration. But performing that action requires know-how in its own right, and that knowledge must in turn be actively brought to bear; and so on, ad infinitum. Stanley shows that Ryle in effect overintellectualizes intellectualism. Ryle assumes that factual knowledge (whether or not it includes knowing-how) is inherently "contemplative" and isolated from action until actively brought into play. But why assume that? As Stanley argues, knowledge-that can play a direct role in action, just as it plays a direct role in reasoning (otherwise, something like Lewis Carroll's famous paradox of "What the Tortoise Said to Achilles" would arise). Knowledge does not require action to be activated.

Having debunked Ryle's arguments, Stanley proceeds to implement his strategy for showing that knowing-how is a kind of knowing-that. The first phase, carried out in Chapter 2, "Knowledge-wh," is to show that knowing-wh in general consists in knowing-that. He implements this strategy linguistically, going on an extended excursion into the formal semantics of questions and in the process giving the reader a crash course on its main developments over the past forty years. This presentation is extremely interesting and informative, though I'm not sure how essential most of it is to the book's primary goal of defending intellectualism.[6] Stanley ultimately defends the natural view that (here I oversimplify) to know wh-Q, where "wh-Q" expresses a wh-question, is to know an answer to wh-Q.[7] This is true whether the question is who Professor Irwin Corey is, when the zipper was invented, or how sausage is made. Just as "who" ranges over persons, "when" over times, etc., so "how" ranges over ways (whatever exactly these are). The key point is that on any plausible semantics of questions, answers, and ascriptions of knowing-how, how-questions are no different in kind from other wh-questions, answers to how-questions are no different in kind from answers to other wh-questions, and ascriptions of knowing-how are no different in kind from ascriptions of other sorts of knowing-wh. But there is much more to say about knowing-how and its ascription, as Stanley shows in subsequent chapters.

In Chapter 3, "PRO and the Representation of First-Person Thought," Stanley focuses on those ascriptions of knowing-how that impute knowledge of the sort activated in action. Typically the embedded how-clause in the ascription is infinitival, with no explicit subject, as in "Novak knows how to serve." The same is true of ascriptions with other wh-infinitival complements, such as "Novak knows what to do against Rafa's serve" and "Novak knows when to go for a winner." Notice that all three, not just the knows-how ascription, ascribe practical knowledge. Indeed, as these examples illustrate, knowing-how can involve other sorts of knowing-wh. And in cases where knowing how to do something is to know a procedure, a sequence of actions, we might say that this knowledge consists in knowing what to do when.

Stanley assumes, following standard linguistic practice, that the infinitival clause in such a knows-how ascription has an unpronounced ("understood") subject, represented as "PRO." So the whole ascription takes roughly the form "S knows [how+PRO+to+VP]." He notes that in some constructions, illustrated by "PRO to err is human," PRO is free, corresponding to the generic pronoun "one" (this is the so-called "arbitrary" PRO), and in others it is controlled by a grammatical antecedent, such as the subject of the main verb in "I promise PRO to leave" and its object in "I told you PRO to leave." In ascriptions of knowing-how, it can go either way. For example, in "Karl knows how PRO to apply for a passport," because the knowledge is generic PRO is naturally construed as free. But in cases more pertinent to the intellectualism debate, where specific bodily movements are involved, PRO is understood as controlled by the subject of the main clause, as in "Karl knows how PRO to curl his tongue."[8] This suggests to Stanley that self-knowledge and self-reference are involved in knowing-how to do something: what you know when you know how to do it is, for some way of doing it, that this is a way for you to do it. Knowing merely that this is a way someone, perhaps only other people, could do it isn't knowledge of the right sort. That is, you might know how something can be done without knowing how to do it in that way yourself. If you do know the latter, Stanley claims, you are thinking of yourself in a special "first-person" way, and this is part of what the target knows-how ascriptions impute to the agent.

Well, what is it to think of oneself in a first-person way? Stanley takes a "quasi-Fregean" (p. 72) approach to this question, by addressing the problem of de se thought in particular and the theory of propositions in general.[9] In perhaps the philosophically headiest part of the book, he discusses various approaches to the question of what it is "to think of oneself as oneself" (p. 88), including Lewis's idea that it involves self-ascription of a property, Shoemaker's notion of immunity to error through misidentification, and Evans' contention that explaining the idea of self-reference requires an account of a certain special relation that one has only to oneself (it's not identity!). Stanley wants to answer a "hard question" about the propositional contribution of a use of the word "I": Is it "Frege's 'special and original way in which each of us is presented to himself and not to any other'? Or is it a way of thinking of [oneself] that is publicly accessible?" (p. 83). But why not both? Each of us is presented to himself in a way that he is presented to no other, but everyone is presented to himself in that very way. This makes the way of thinking both special and publicly accessible. We do not have to assume that only Frege (say) is capable of grasping Frege's first-person way of thinking. Anyone can grasp that first-person way of thinking but, of course, can think of only himself in that way. This leaves open whether knowing how to do something always involves thinking of oneself.

In Chapter 4, "Ways of Thinking," Stanley defends his broadly Fregean framework. Wanting to "demystify" ways of thinking, he argues (as have many others) that they are essential to an account of propositional thought and of the ascription of knowledge, and that this helps account for the functional role of propositional knowledge in general. In Chapter 5, "Knowledge How," he takes up the special case of knowing how to do something. Not only, he claims, does one think of oneself in a distinctive first-person way (as agent, presumably), one also thinks in a "practical" way of a way of performing the action. Notice that the word "way" does double duty here, covering both ways of thinking and ways of doing things. In particular, there are ways (including practical ways) of thinking of ways of doing things.

Stanley acknowledges the common complaint that he and Williamson were not very specific about practical ways of thinking (or "practical modes of presentation") of ways of doing things, but instead of getting more specific about them (alluding to their "distinctive functional role" and contrasting them with demonstrative ways of thinking is not being very specific), he argues more thoroughly for the need for them. He establishes that "the need for practical ways of thinking in explaining intentional states is widely recognized" (p. 124) by quoting Heidegger on tools, such as a hammer: "The less we just stare at the hammer-Thing, and the more we seize hold of it and use it, the more primordial does our relationship to it become." This illuminating if less than lucid passage seems phenomenologically on track and consonant with recent research on motor control. In the course of action, while we subconsciously anticipate the expected experience of bringing about the envisaged result (the "efference copy," as psychologists say), we tend to focus on the envisaged result itself (the "distal effect," as they say).

However, this also suggests a possibility regarding the case of "sub-intentional" actions, such as simple, spontaneous reactions like brushing away a fly or scratching an itch, as well as the fine-grained components of "larger," intentional actions. In performing a sub-intentional action, one merely represents the bodily movement, not the fact that one is bringing it about in a certain way. Arguably, such a representation is inherently from the first-person perspective, not because it involves a representation of oneself but because it does not need to. Just as you don't have to think of your thoughts and feelings as your own as opposed to anyone else's, so in acting you don't have to think of your body and its movements as your own as opposed to anyone else's. Compare the case of a demonstrative thought, say, the thought that the cat in front of you is within arm's reach. You do not have to represent yourself in order to represent the cat as being within arm's reach of you. Representing it as within arm's reach, full stop, just is to represent it as within arm's reach of you.[10] Perhaps something like this is true of our representations of envisaged bodily movements. So, for example, perhaps knowing how to point your right index finger doesn't require thinking of yourself pointing the finger but merely thinking in a practical way of its becoming extended in a certain direction.[11] In effect, this suggestion combines the first-person way of thinking associated with the occurrence of PRO in a knows-how ascription with the practical way of thinking associated with the verb phrase describing the action.

Stanley's main claim in Chapter 5 is that knows-how ascriptions with infinitival complements ascribe propositional de re (as opposed to descriptive) knowledge, of a way of performing an action, thatone could perform it in that way.[12] It imputes "knowledge of counterfactual success" (a phrase borrowed from Katherine Hawley 2003). Presumably a necessary condition for this success is that the agent have the resources (physical wherewithal, tools, materials, etc.), opportunity, and motivation (I'll call this the "ROM" for short), but knowing-how does not require actually being able to succeed in performing the action, since one might not actually have the ROM. So, we might say, knowing how to do something is the cognitive component of the ability to do it. However this knowledge gets put to work, it would help explain one's success if one were to try to perform the action when the ROM condition is met. But it is not clear that the counterfactual success condition is necessary, since one can know how to do something one has the ROM to do even though one may not succeed, as when shooting a free throw, or is even likely to fail, as when taking a three-point shot.[13]

Perhaps the trick is to constrain the range of possible situations in which, according to the ascription, the agent could perform the action in question. Stanley contends that "natural interpretations" of knows-how ascriptions are somehow "fixed" by context (he doesn't explain how). He attributes this to the semantic context sensitivity of "how," and fails to consider that the locus of this sensitivity might be in the speaker's use of the act-description in the infinitival clause. If, following David Braun's (2006) advice, we distinguish an interrogative sentence from the question it semantically expresses, we can easily see that it can be used to ask a question more specific than the one it expresses. Similarly, the interrogative clause in a knows-how ascription can be used to attribute knowledge of how to do something more specific than the type of act semantically designated. Interrogatives, like declaratives, can be used loosely.

Before proceeding to the objections Stanley takes up in the last three chapters, I want to raise some questions about his account's central notion of ways of doing things. He says very little about what they are, either by way of explanation or illustration. Once or twice he indicates parenthetically that ways are methods, but that's about it. It would seem that whatever a way is, if you know a way of doing something and do it in that way, this knowledge explains your doing or at least trying to do it in that way (it doesn't explain your doing it rather than something else or nothing at all). But there are different cases to consider here, and each one raises an interesting question.

In many cases, performing a certain action involves performing various sub-actions, perhaps successively, perhaps simultaneously, perhaps in more complicated relationships in which sub-actions are intertwined (in a dance routine or in slalom skiing, for example, certain sub-actions are prepared by prior sub-actions, perhaps even begun before the prior one is completed). Take just the first case, in which performing a certain action consists in performing a sequence of sub-actions. Knowing how to do it consists, presumably, in knowing that one could do it by performing the sub-actions in that sequence and in knowing how to perform them. Obviously that involves more knowing-how.

Now consider actions that are not composed of sub-actions. Knowing how to perform a simple action cannot consist in knowing what sub-actions to perform and how to perform them. But a simple action may or may not be basic. A basic action is not performed by doing anything else. Action theorists generally take basic actions to be bodily movings, like extending a finger or curling one's tongue. Then knowing how to perform a simple but non-basic action is to know that one could do it by performing a certain basic action.[14] But what about knowing how to perform the basic action? Say you want to ring a doorbell, and you have already extended your right index finger and made contact with the doorbell. You know that you could now ring the doorbell by pressing it with your finger, and you know you could do that by exerting a forward force with your finger. But what do you have to know in order to know how to do that? In the basic case, there is no way of acting, no method or means, that you have to connect to the type of action. Rather, it seems, you just have to think of the action itself, albeit in a practical way.[15]

On the other end of the spectrum is the case of knowing how to engage in a complex, open-ended activity, like playing soccer, hiking in unfamiliar terrain, or raising kids. Does knowing how to engage in such an activity, especially at a high level, consist in knowing how to perform each of a very large but determinate set of actions, knowing which of them to perform in each of a vast variety of situations (this would require knowing a huge number of conditional propositions), and knowing how to identify the situation one is in? This is what Stanley's account suggests, but it seems that expertise requires being able to decide, perhaps right on the spot, what to do next, and that doing this goes beyond applying one's knowledge. Consider that in the course of performance one may need to catch and compensate for tendencies to go off course (literally, in the case of slalom skiing), to make mid-course corrections of subtle errors in execution, and to adjust for unexpected difficulties or obstacles. Partly cognitive skills like aiming, tracking, and timing can be required. These and other aspects of skilled performance involve a continuous flow of perceptual information in one direction and motor information in the other, and along the way this feedback process includes comparing, generally not consciously, the developing course of action with how it was envisaged. The cognitive aspects of such abilities do not seem to consist merely in being able to apply knowledge one already has; or, if they do, this knowledge cannot consist in knowing a vast number of conditionals. Success requires differential responses to situational variables, and it is hard to see how one's knowledge of how to engage in the activity determines precisely what one does in a given situation.[16] Experience teaches, but it doesn't yield an algorithm for action.

It would have been instructive if Stanley had applied his account to these different cases by way of concrete examples. In several places he discusses the act of catching a fly ball, but he focuses solely on the subtask of judging the flight of the ball, indeed the limited case in which the ball comes directly toward the fielder and the decision is whether to move forwards or backwards or to stay put. This was the subject of a psychological study he cites that factored out tracking balls going in other directions and adjusting for sun, wind, and field conditions, not to mention the physical act of actually catching the ball.[17] Catching the ball, as opposed to merely judging its flight, requires knowing how to approach it while maintaining sight of it (that's not always feasible), when to reach for it, how to extend one's arm and position one's glove, and, if necessary, how to jump or dive for the ball. All this requires a great deal of timing, footwork, and coordination. And since there are all sorts of different fly balls that outfielders (or infielders or catchers) know how to catch, there is no one bit of know-how that comprises knowing how to catch a fly ball. At one point Stanley writes, "The fact that a skilled outfielder has de re knowledge of a way of thinking of fielding the ball, and thinks of that way practically, explains why he is able to react fluidly to the occasional unusual fly ball" (p. 182). Evidently, this is not a matter of having conditional knowledge of what to do in every such situation for, as Stanley continues, "One can only have the right kind of propositional knowledge of a way of doing something if one's dispositional structure is sufficiently complex to accommodate novel situations." But how does one's knowledge-how underpin this dispositional structure?

In the last three chapters, Stanley responds to various objections to intellectualism. He begins Chapter 6, "Ascribing Knowledge How," by taking up the objection that his account exploits special features of English ascriptions of knowing-how and fails to apply to their counterparts in languages in which their complements "do not superficially take the form of embedded question constructions" (p. 132). The linguistic variation here is extensive, and Stanley gives examples from many languages, some exotic, that illustrate one or another of five variant forms. This comparative excursion is interesting and instructive, especially in regard to French, which uses the bare infinitive form, as in "savoir faire." Stanley analyzes the variant form in each case as having the same content as the corresponding knows-wh construction in English. So, he contends, "it is straightforward to give a semantics that assigns states of knowing how in my favored sense to all the different ways of ascribing knowing how" (p. 132). However, he doesn't mention alternative constructions in English for ascribing knowing-how.

In everyday speech, we can use "Michael knows a way to swim" just as well as "Michael knows how to swim" to ascribe the same know-how. The alternative form comes in handy for ascribing knowledge of multiple ways, as with "Michael knows four ways to swim." If we use the "knows-how" construction, we'd still have to mention ways: "Michael knows how to swim in four ways." Interestingly, there are no analogous constructions for knowing-when or knowing-where. Sentences like these are ungrammatical: "Michael knows when to fly to London at three times," and "Michael knows where to buy flippers in three places." In contrast, these sentences are perfectly fine: "Michael knows three times at which to fly to London," and "Michael knows three places at which to buy flippers." Notice that in these sentences the complement of "knows" is a (quantified) noun phrase.

This observation suggests that in at least some knows-how ascriptions with clausal complements, the embedded infinitival how-clauses are what linguists call "free relatives," clauses that look like interrogative clauses but behave more like noun phrases. That is, rather than express propositions about ways of doing things, they function as descriptions of ways of doing things. If this is right, that would support the "non-propositional intellectualism" recently proposed by John Bengson and Marc Moffett (2011b), according to which (this is my rough approximation) what one knows when one knows how to do something is a way of doing it so thought of. Now Stanley might reply that this is really propositional intellectualism in disguise, and argue that even when the infinitival how-clause is a free relative it expresses what linguists call a "concealed question." That seems to be what the noun phrase complement does in a sentence like "Otto knows the capital of North Dakota," true just in case Otto knows what the capital of North Dakota is. However, this reply neglects other verbs, such as "demonstrate," "practice," and "perfect," which also take infinitival how-clauses as complements. What you demonstrate, practice, or perfect is a way of doing it, not a fact about how to do it. Supposing that some how-clauses are free relatives suggests why it makes perfectly good sense to say that a person can know a lot about how to play golf, how to write a philosophy paper, or how to improvise at the keyboard.

The last two chapters respond to various objections, most of which either mistakenly associate the knowing-that/knowing-how distinction with other distinctions or else mistakenly attribute certain dubious implications to intellectualism. Chapter 7, "The Cognitive Science of Practical Knowledge," does not actually discuss substantive scientific accounts of cognitive states underlying action.[18] Rather, it disposes of some difficulties for intellectualism that might seem to arise from certain developments in cognitive science, and it marshals some recent findings to dispose of other difficulties. For example, Stanley rebuts the objection that the distinction between declarative and procedural knowledge poses a problem for intellectualism, at least if it corresponds to the distinction between knowing-that and knowing-how. The worry is that declarative knowledge involves explicit representation of propositions but procedural knowledge does not. Stanley argues that procedural knowledge can be propositional even if its propositional contents are not explicitly represented. The mere fact that the procedural knowledge exercised in the performance of a task is not conscious or readily verbalized, and is realized in a domain-specific and informationally encapsulated mental module, does not show that it isn't propositional in content (not that this shows that it is). So it is no argument against intellectualism that people are often unable to articulate how they do what they know how to do, still less that performance is often impaired if they are required to monitor what they do in order to verbalize how they do it. Stanley also counters objections that one can know how to do something without knowing that one knows how to do it and without being justified in believing that one knows how to do it, by pointing out that knowing-that does not have such second-order requirements either. In a nutshell, such objections, like Ryle's regress arguments, overintellectualize intellectualism.

Chapter 8, "Knowledge Justified," aims to rebut objections to the effect that the psychological states involved in knowing-how, even if their contents are propositional, do not meet the requirements on knowledge.[19] In answer to the worry that knowing-how does not admit of Gettier cases, for example, Stanley cites examples of knowing-that which do not admit of Gettier cases either. As for cases of intuitively true knowledge ascriptions that attribute something clearly weaker than knowledge, Stanley argues that though intuitively true they are in fact false. What happens in these cases is that the attributions merely seem true because they are made with the pragmatic aim of attributing true belief (p. 180). In ordinary conversation we are often more interested in the information a person has than in whether it qualifies as knowledge.

Stanley briefly discusses the relationship between knowledge, ability, and practice. Consider the difference between knowing how to perform an action fluidly and merely knowing how to perform it cumbersomely. Suppose, for example, that you know how to touch-type but want to do it with more speed and fewer errors. So you practice and get better. Stanley suggests that the benefit of practice is not to give you new knowledge but to enable you to apply your prior knowledge directly, without having "to engage in a distinct action of consulting the propositional knowledge" (p. 184). Practice yields so-called "muscle memory," as when you develop a "feel" for punching in your ATM number without having to think about how. You have the pattern of finger movements down pat but haven't learned anything new.

Yet surely we often do learn new things with practice and experience. This raises questions about the relationship between how well one can do something and how much one knows about how to do it. As you learn how to do something better (thanks to training and practice), are you learning a fact better and better (what could that amount to?), are you learning more and more facts about how to do it, or are you learning how to do more and more of what comprises doing it (if "it" is a complex activity)? If, as Stanley seems to suggest, you are learning how better to implement the knowledge you already have, what does that know-how consist in? This had better not lead to a Ryle-style regress problem. Stanley invokes Ryle's "multi-track" dispositions (p. 183), perhaps to avoid that problem.

To sum up, Stanley's indirect, linguistically based strategy goes only so far. His formulation of intellectualism is schematic, and his defense of it is generic. He makes a strong prima facie case for the general thesis that knowing how to do something is to know of a certain way that one could do it in that way, but he doesn't exclude the possibility that in some cases what one knows in knowing-how is a way of doing something rather than a fact about a way of doing it. Most importantly, he doesn't tell us much about what ways of doing things are or about how they might differ in kind, depending on whether what one knows is, say, how to wiggle a finger, how to concentrate, how to regain one's balance when one slips, how to pick up a glass, how to use chopsticks, how to shoot a free throw, how to shoot a jump shot, how to play basketball, how to give a sales pitch, or how to win friends and influence people. I have raised other questions provoked by Know How, but I wouldn't presume to construe them as decisive objections. For all I know they have answers consistent with intellectualism. So I'd rather bill them as loose ends and hope that Stanley ties them up in an equally fine sequel.


Bach, Kent (1978), "A Representational Theory of Action," Philosophical Studies 34: 361-379.

Bach, Kent (2005), "Questions and Answers".

Bengson, John and Marc A. Moffett, eds. (2011a), Knowing How: Essays on Knowledge, Mind, and Action, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Bengson, John and Marc A. Moffett (2011b), "Non-propositional Intellectualism," in Bengson and Moffett (eds.), pp. 161-195.

Braun, David (2006), "Now You Know Who Hong Oak Yun Is," Philosophical Issues 16: 24-42.

Brogaard, Berit (2011), "Knowledge-How: A Unified Account," in Bengson and Moffett, (eds.), pp. 136-160.

Clarke, Randolph (2010), "Skilled Activity and the Causal Theory of Action," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 80: 523-550.

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Glick, Ephraim (2011), "Two Methodologies for Evaluating Intellectualism," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 83: 398-434.

Hawley, Katherine (2003), "Success and Knowledge How," American Philosophical Quarterly 40: 19-31.

Jeannerod, Marc (1997), The Cognitive Neuroscience of Action, Oxford: Blackwell.

Kumar, Victor (2011), "In Support of Anti-Intellectualism," Philosophical Studies 152: 135-54.

Morsella, E., Bargh, J.A., & Gollwitzer, P.M., eds. (2009). Oxford Handbook of Human Action, New York: Oxford University Press.

Rosenbaum, David A. (2002), "Motor Control," in S. Yantis (ed.), Stevens' Handbook of Experimental Psychology: Vol. 1, Sensation and Perception, 3rd ed., New York: Wiley, pp. 315-339.

Ryle, Gilbert (1949), The Concept of Mind, New York: Barnes & Noble, Inc.

Schaffer, Dennis M., Scott M. Krauchunas, Marianna Eddy, and Michael K. McBeath (2004), "How Dogs Navigate to Catch Frisbees," Psychological Science 15: 437-441.

Schaffer, Jonathan (2007), "Knowing the Answer," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 75: 383-403.

Stanley, Jason and Timothy Williamson (2001), "Knowing How," Journal of Philosophy 98: 411-444.

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[1] I include a hyphen in locutions like "knowing-how" and "knowing-that" as a reminder that they are cropped phrases in need of clausal complements.

[2] For examples and references see the introduction to Bengson and Moffett's (2011a) recently published collection of essays on knowing-how.

[3] "Intellectualism" is too crude a label for this thesis, since intellectualism need not be propositional. Indeed, Bengson and Moffett (2011b) have recently defended what they call "non-propositional intellectualism."

[4] Presumably, then, your knowledge-wh is exhausted by your knowledge-that. That is, the totality of your knowledge-that provides answers to all the wh-questions to which you have answers. An interesting complication here is that the same proposition can be the answer (or an answer) to different questions. This suggests that knowing a propositional answer to a question requires thinking of the proposition as an answer to that question. See Schaffer (2007) and Bach (2005).

[5] See, for example, Jeannerod (1997), Morsella et al (2009), and Ericsson et al (2006).

[6] Stanley might have considered deferring much of this discussion to an appendix, where it would have been just as valuable without breaking the continuity of the book's discussion of knowing-how.

[7] This oversimplifies, because according to the different formal accounts Stanley discusses, questions denote, alternatively, sets of propositions, sets of true propositions, or functions from possible worlds to propositions. However, none of these seem to be things of the sort that people want and know answers to (models should not be confused with what they model). Also, although we can gladly concede that knowing wh-Q is knowing a true answer to wh-Q, we should not so readily concede that in sentences of the form "S knows wh-Q," the verb "knows" relates the subject to an answer to wh-Q rather than to the question itself.

[8] Stanley does not argue here for either lexical ambiguity, between arbitrary and controlled PRO, or structural ambiguity, in the form "S knows how PRO to A."

[9] Stanley argues for construing the propositional contents of thoughts as more fine-grained than sets of possible worlds or structured, Russellian complexes of objects, properties, and relations. He evidently views propositions as amalgams of Russellian propositions and Fregean thoughts, with objects, properties, and relations paired off with ways of thinking (Fregean modes of presentation).

[10] So this does not make one's thought non-propositional (compare the "predicational theory" of knowing-how that Stanley (pp. 75ff) rightly criticizes). Rather, it suggests that not every constituent of the propositional content of a thought has to be represented in order for the thought to have that content.

[11] That is, it may suffice to represent the movement (e.g., a certain finger extending) without representing it as the result of an action (pointing that finger). This distinction figured in my version of the causal theory of action, which focused on the execution of action rather than its initiation (Bach 1978). At around the same time, Harry Frankfurt (1978) argued that standard causal theories mistakenly focus on the initiation of action instead of its guidance. Recently Randolph Clarke (2010) has revived this neglected argument.

[12] If the way in question is a manner, such as knowing how to speak to a cop (answer: politely), what you know is how you should act. This is not a way of the relevant sort.

[13] Performance error is, as Victor Kumar (2011) has argued, something that an adequate account of knowing-how must reckon with. He argues that knowing-how can't be just a matter of getting a certain fact right; because of its role in guiding action, it also has a "world-to-mind direction of fit." To contrast it with reasons and desires, which motivate rather than guide action, he characterizes knowing-how as a "non-motivational directive state."

[14] This simplifies, in that a non-basic action can be related to a basic action via a "by-chain" of relatively more basic non-basic actions. The usual example is killing someone by shooting him by firing a gun (aimed at him) by pressing the trigger by moving one's right index finger in a certain way.

[15] Stanley briefly mentions basic actions on the last page of the book (p. 190), where he suggests that for them the requisite propositional knowledge consists in having the right disposition when forming the intention to perform the action. But this can't be necessary, since basic actions are often not intentional.

[16] This is what the psychologist David Rosenbaum (2002) calls the "degrees of freedom problem, and what the philosopher Wayne Wu (2011) calls the "many-many problem."

[17] Schaffer et al. (2004) investigated how dogs catch Frisbees and found that dogs judge the flight of a Frisbee in much the same way as outfielders judge the flight of a ball.

[18] It seems that an adequate account of knowing-how should square with the science of performance errors, notably substitution (or "capturing") errors like intending to do one thing and inadvertently or absentmindedly doing another, e.g., brushing one's teeth instead of taking an aspirin or typing "competent" instead of "computer." In such cases one is not matching a way of acting to an action: one does not think that taking an aspirin is a way of brushing one's teeth or that typing "competent" is a way of typing "computer."

[19] As Ephraim Glick (2011) has pointed out, how one assesses intellectualism depends in part on how liberal one's conception of knowledge is. In Berit Brogaard's view, for example, some cases of knowing-how involve what she calls "ability states," by which she means "primitive knowledge states which are not belief-entailing" (2011, p. 150).