Knowing Better: Virtue, Deliberation, and Normative Ethics

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Daniel Star, Knowing Better: Virtue, Deliberation, and Normative Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2015, 147pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199570416.

Reviewed by Alex Worsnip, New York University


Daniel Star's excellent book is organized around a puzzle that is thrown up by two apparently anodyne claims that nevertheless stand in tension with one another. On one hand, it seems that ordinary people with no familiarity with philosophical ethics are capable of being good, and virtuous. On the other hand, it seems that the enterprise of philosophical ethics is not a waste of time: we are capable of learning something about how we should live by engaging in ethical theorizing. Star's project in this book is to reconcile these two observations. In the course of doing so, he makes original and insightful contributions to an impressively wide range of independently important philosophical debates concerning -- among other things -- the structure of ethical theory, the analysis of reasons for action and belief, the nature of virtue, and the connections between knowledge, evidence and action.

Star's approach commendably bridges a number of oft-isolated philosophical subdisciplines -- virtue theory, "reasonsology", and Williamsonian knowledge-first epistemology -- and evidences the fruitfulness of doing so. Star shows a healthy disrespect for the boundaries between epistemology and ethics (and, indeed, between normative ethics and metaethics), seamlessly integrating the two where other writers content themselves with focusing on one and throwing in ham-fisted analogies that betray their relative ignorance of the other. Still more importantly, Star's approach is relentlessly creative, both in its framing of the puzzle that motivates the book and in its solution to it. He largely avoids being imprisoned by niche or faddish insider disputes about these topics -- of which there are many -- and is very much the master of his own project, framing the issues as he sees them rather than in response to the contingent way that the literature has developed.

The book is full of dense, detailed and finely-crafted arguments -- in fact, coming in at a mere 137 pages of main text, it could perhaps have done with a bit more space, given its far-reaching and ambitious scope, to let these arguments breathe. I will try to largely address the big picture of Star's project. The questions I will raise are ones that Star will no doubt have more to say about, but I hope that they will help to orient the reader to some of the pressure-points in his argument.

The general form of Star's solution to the problem I summarized at the start involves appeal to a "two-level" account of ethical thinking and of reasons. One level of reasons -- "fundamental" reasons -- functions to justify actions, and the other level -- "derivative reasons" -- to guide actions (x). A fact is a fundamental reason for action if it plays a role in making an act right or wrong. The fundamental reasons are those that we try to specify in our ethical theories and to gain knowledge of in our ethical theorizing (15). Derivative reasons are less clearly defined, but are presumably those reasons that are non-fundamental; Star says that they involve "much mundane evidence concerning what we ought to do" (16). Crucially, while derivative reasons are supposed to be explained by fundamental reasons, one is not supposed to require any knowledge of fundamental reasons in order to be able to reliably recognize and respond to derivative reasons; indeed, Star even suggests that we can only come to knowledge of fundamental reasons via knowledge of derivative reasons (16). And derivative reasons suffice to reliably guide us in action toward the good and what we ought to do. Thus, ordinary people can reliably respond to derivative reasons, even in ignorance of the fundamental reasons that we learn about through ethical theorizing. Paired with Star's account of virtue in terms of reasons-responsiveness, we then get the result that ordinary people can be virtuous without being acquainted with ethical theory, and yet that ethical theory delivers ethical knowledge worth having.

One big question I have about Star's project regards just how necessary the details of his specific views about reasons and virtue are to the successful execution of the general strategy he deploys to solve his puzzle -- notwithstanding the independent interest and plausibility of these specific views. In a series of papers with Stephen Kearns, Star has developed an important account of reasons as evidence. On this view, what it is for a fact F to be a reason to Φ is for F to be evidence that A ought to Φ. Star claims that this conception of reasons as evidence is crucial to his solution of the puzzle (x, 17). But this might be questioned.

Suppose we were simply to say that ordinary people are largely well-attuned to the moral features of particular situations and actions when making on-line judgments and decisions about particular cases but much poorer at articulating the general principles that explain their particular judgments or engaging in systematic theorizing across cases. This kind of structure is not unique to morality.[1] We are excellent at being sensitive to subtle features of a sentence that call for a particular grammatical device or construction but poor at articulating what we are responding to and the general rules that explain why the construction was called for. The epistemic judgments of ordinary folk about whether a subject knows something can be remarkably sensitive to complex counterfactual considerations, but when introductory students are asked to articulate plausible conditions on knowledge that systematize these judgments, they flounder. Now, no doubt there are some interesting philosophical questions about how to describe these cases: for example, can it be correct to describe someone as tacitly following a rule, or relying on a principle, if they are utterly unable to articulate such a rule or principle when asked? But whatever the right way to describe it, the general phenomenon is real.

Such a diagnosis of the situation of ordinary folk with respect to morality is not so far removed from the one that Star gives to resolve his puzzle. As Star puts it, on his view, ordinary people that are virtuous are "very skilled at weighing (derivative) reasons, but also … [often lack] knowledge of true normative principles that might allow them to work out what they ought to do in very difficult cases, where the reasons they encounter are of similar weight" (22). Philosophical reflection is distinctive in that it involves thinking more systematically and coming "to know ultimate explanations for the rightness or wrongness of particular acts" (25). Since Star (rightly) wants to count non-philosophers as capable of virtue in a full and robust sense, the benefits of philosophical reflection about ethics are inevitably (as they are on the view that I have suggested) somewhat intellectual; it cannot be that philosophical reflection about ethics is a requirement for leading a good life. Yet the view I have suggested does not rely on the reasons as evidence account.

Of course, none of this speaks against the reasons as evidence account itself, which is defended as a positive theory of reasons in chapter 2. Here again, though, I do have a big-picture worry. Consider the following two plausible claims.

  1. One ought to Φ iff one has most reason to Φ: there is no gap between these two possibilities.
  2. It's not (always) the case that one ought to Φ iff one's evidence (on-balance) supports (belief in) the proposition that one ought to Φ: there is a gap between these two possibilities. (For, one can have misleading evidence about whether one ought to Φ.)

Now, the reasons as evidence view entails that:

  1. One has most reason to Φ iff one's evidence (on-balance) supports (belief in) the proposition that one ought to Φ.

Clearly, (1)-(3) are jointly inconsistent. Thus, it seems that the reasons as evidence view must either reject (1) or (2) -- either opening a gap where there seems to be none or closing a gap that appears genuine.

Star suggested to me (private communication) that this dilemma might be resolved by appealing to a distinction between an "objective" and "subjective" sense of 'ought'. Perhaps it is true that the evidence one possesses can on-balance support false beliefs about whether one objectively ought to Φ (see xi, 102-3). But this "objective" 'ought' is relativized to all the facts, or perhaps in some sense to a more complete body of evidence, much of which one does not possess. Consequently, in this sense of 'ought', it will be false that one ought to Φ iff one has most reason to Φ (where having a reason is understood as possessing evidence). Conversely, when it comes to the "subjective" 'ought', understood as 'ought' relativized to the evidence one possesses, it's true that one subjectively ought to Φ iff one has most reason to Φ. But, the reply continues, it cannot be that the evidence one possesses on-balance supports a false belief about whether one ought to Φ in this sense, where 'ought' is understood as being itself relativized to the evidence one possesses.

Although this is a neat reply, it is not clear that one cannot have on-balance misleading evidence about whether one ought to Φ even relative to one's possessed evidence. This is brought out most sharply in epistemological discussions of "higher-order evidence". According to numerous epistemologists, one can be in a position where has one misleading higher-order evidence about what one's evidence supports, in such a way that ultimately, one's total evidence (including both first-order and higher-order evidence) on-balance supports a false higher-order belief about whether that same body of total evidence supports believing some first-order proposition.[2] In cases where what one's evidence supports determines what one ought to believe, this would amount to a situation where one has on-balance misleading evidence about whether one ought to Φ, even in a sense of 'ought' that is relativized to one's possessed evidence. (Though I cannot argue this here, I think that if this can happen in the epistemic case, it can happen in the practical case too. Certainly, it would suggest that such a possibility is not inherently incoherent.)

The more general point here is that in analyzing reasons to Φ as evidence that one ought to Φ, the reasons as evidence account arguably collapses something first-order with something more higher-order. Again, the epistemic case brings this out sharply. Intuitively, reasons to believe p (at least setting pragmatic reasons for belief aside) consist in evidence for p itself. Star acknowledges the plausibility of this claim but thinks it is not a problem for him since when one has evidence for p, one thereby gets (some) evidence that one ought to believe p (13, 109). But actually he needs something stronger than this. To reconcile the claim that reasons to believe p consist in evidence for p with the claim that reasons to believe p consist in reasons to believe that one ought to believe p, Star must treat evidence for p and evidence that one ought to believe p (or has reasons or evidence to do so) as equivalent, collapsing the two.

Part of the reason that reasons as evidence sounds so plausible is that reasons for belief are intuitively evidence: evidence for the proposition believed. But there is a reason why Star does not simply say that reasons to believe p are evidence for p and stay away from claims about one's evidence that one ought to believe p, thus avoiding the problems that I have been presenting. For this would not yield an account that could be generalized to reasons for action. It is the desire to provide an account general to both belief and action that forces Star to analyze reasons as evidence for a higher-order normative claim: that one ought to believe p, or that one ought to Φ.

Indeed, as Star stresses, his view grounds aspects of practical normativity in epistemic normativity. Practical reasons are analyzed as evidence concerning what one ought to do, and correspondingly, practical virtue -- which Star understands as reasons-responsiveness -- turns out to be a kind of epistemic virtue -- that of sensitively responding to evidence (68, 97, 99). Yet it is worth noting -- though Star does not make this explicit -- that this stops well short of a reduction of practical normativity as a whole to epistemic normativity. This is because, on Star's view, though practical reasons are evidence, they are evidence of independent normative facts about what one ought to do -- independent normative facts that are explanatorily fundamental and that are not themselves reducible to anything epistemic. On what explains or grounds these normative facts, the view is silent, in a way that may seem to leave them mysterious. This is so especially if they are construed as metaphysically independent of our reasons, in such a way that our reasons only function as evidence that (fallibly) points the way toward them.

The last crucial piece of Star's picture is his account of virtue, which, as I noted above, he analyzes as a kind of reasons-responsiveness. Star's view is that virtue requires correctly responding to one's (derivative) reasons -- though one may sometimes blamelessly fail to respond correctly to the fundamental reasons. Here again, one might wonder if there are other opportunities for Star to resolve his central puzzle without all the machinery he appeals to. Once or twice Star says that virtue requires one only to "do one's best" to respond to reasons (xi), or that a virtuous person may, in difficult cases, (blamelessly) act on reasons that are not normatively decisive (82), without explicitly relying on the derivative/fundamental distinction. One could follow this lead by saying that while philosophical ethics affords us knowledge of what our reasons actually are, we can be virtuous in the absence of such knowledge by merely doing our best to respond to our reasons. This way of framing things does not seem to make any ineliminable appeal to a distinction between derivative and fundamental reasons.

If I am right that the that the details of Star's views may not all be needed for his solution to the puzzle that motivates this book, then the puzzle may ultimately be better thought of as providing an entry-point for delving into a range of independently fascinating philosophical topics. And on these terms -- which are surely ultimately the ones that matter -- Star's book is a resounding success. The questions I have raised here serve only to illustrate the depth of these topics and the creativity and distinctiveness of Star's particular accounts of them -- accounts that it will be important for all participants in the literature to engage with.


For help with this review, I'm grateful to Nic Bommarito, Jonathan Phillips, and especially Daniel Star.

[1] For a classic psychological analysis of the more general phenomenon here, see R.E. Nisbett and T.D. Wilson, "Telling More Than We Can Know: Verbal Reports on Mental Processes," Psychological Review, 84(3).

[2] See, inter alia, my "The Conflict of Evidence and Coherence," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research (forthcoming), §IV. Interestingly, Williamson -- who is a major influence on Star's views -- is one of the philosophers that has done the most to make the possibility of such strongly misleading higher-order evidence plausible. As I argue in §IV(a) of my above-cited article, this possibility plausibly follows from Williamson's equation of evidence with knowledge -- an account that Star accepts with a slight modification (108) -- plus the failure of "KK", the principle that if one knows, then one knows that one knows. See also especially Williamson, "Very Improbable Knowing," Erkenntnis 79(5) (2014).