Knowing by Perceiving

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Alan Millar, Knowing by Perceiving, Oxford University Press, 2019, 222pp., $70.00
(hbk), ISBN 9780198755692.

Reviewed by Ian Phillips, University of Birmingham, Princeton University


Alan Millar's elegant new monograph offers an original approach to perception and perceptual knowledge from a veteran of the field. In crudest outline, Millar defends a common-factor view of perceptual experience combined with a distinctive epistemological disjunctivism on which perceptual knowledge acquisition consists in the exercise of recognitional capacities. Millar develops these core views in chapters three to five and I consider them in detail below. His book, however, contains much else besides.

Chapters six and seven are devoted to abilities in general, as well as to a comparison of Millar's approach with that of virtue epistemologists such as Sosa (2007). These standalone discussions will be invaluable to anyone interested in abilities in epistemology or philosophy of mind. Millar defends two important theses. First, that abilities are never exercised defectively: one only exercises an ability to Φ when one actually Φs. Second, that to count as having the ability to Φ one must be reliably successful at Φ-ing. Federer's ability to ace might seem a counter-example to both claims. In response, Millar argues that such hard-performance abilities (contrast easy-performance abilities like being able to type) are best understood in terms of success-rate abilities: abilities to Φ with a suitably high rate of success. Federer has a success-rate ability to ace. This he reliably and successfully executes even when his opponent returns.

Chapter eight extends Millar's account beyond simple cases of perceptual knowledge. First, to cases of knowledge from a perceived indicator, such as when one sees that a deer has passed by from its tracks. Second, to cases of general, factual knowledge, such as knowing that Penny Marshall directed Big, or that humans are a primary driver of climate change. Such facts are often passively "soaked up" (183) and preserved unmoored from their original sources. Though confessedly "tentative forays" (xi), these treatments are richly rewarding. The second is also timely. Epistemologists have written voluminously on fake barns. Millar encourages them to pay attention to the real issue of fake news and its threat to factual knowledge.

Millar's monograph is bookended with various obiter dicta on epistemological and philosophical method. We know a great deal, including about what and how we know, and epistemologists should not be shy to let such knowledge constrain their theorizing. Yes, epistemology takes place largely in the armchair. But that does not make it merely about the concept of knowledge as opposed to knowledge itself. When we sit down, we bring a great deal of experience with us, not least of acquiring and exploiting knowledge. For all that, it matters that our account of the nature of knowledge squares with an account of our conception of knowledge. In discussing skepticism, we should not turn philosophy into a game by indulging in the fantasy that, for all we know, we know nothing. The task is rather to explain where the sceptic has gone wrong. Here, as throughout, readers are left in no doubt that they are in the hands of someone who has thought long and deeply about these issues.

In what remains, I critically examine Millar's central account of perception and (simple) perceptual knowledge. We know many things by perceiving. Pulling the cork, the sommelier knows immediately that the bottle is corked. She can smell the taint. Playing hide-and-seek, a sister spots her brother's foot poking out from behind the sofa. "Come out! I know where you are. I can see you." A short walk from their study site in the Brazilian forest, a primatologist hears a distinctive sequence of high-pitched calls. They know a black-fronted titi monkey, Callicebus nigrifrons, is somewhere in the trees above them.

Reflecting on such cases, it is natural to think that perception affords us a perspective on the world in which aspects of that world present themselves to us, and that it is the conscious presence of these elements (or equivalently our perceptual contact or acquaintance with them) which explains how we come know and think about them (see, e.g., Eilan 2001). Two tempting thoughts animate resistance to this picture. The first is that our experiential standing in cases of genuine perception is one which is shared with our experiential standing in cases of hallucination. The second is that our epistemological standing derives exclusively from our experiential standing. Together these thoughts imply that our epistemological standing in cases of genuine perception is shared with our standing in cases of hallucination. Notoriously, this raises a puzzle as to how perceptual knowledge is so much as possible.

According to (disjunctivist) relationalists or naïve realists, we should reject the first thought and deny that our perceptual and hallucinatory experiences are of the same fundamental kind. This allows us to preserve the idea that our epistemological standing exclusively derives from our experiential standing, consistent with the natural thought that perceptual knowledge is to be explained in terms of genuine acquaintance with worldly features. Millar tells us that he has never found this conception plausible (x). It is thus the second thought -- that our epistemological standing exclusively derives from our experiential standing -- which he rejects. In its place, Millar insists (with the naïve realist) that our epistemological standing derives in part from our perceptual standing. His distinctive claim is that this is quite consistent with a common-factor conception of experience.

Millar expands on his dissatisfaction with naïve realism in chapter three, developing a non-relational, direct realist alternative. According to Millar, perception is direct in that it is not typically perceptually mediated. We routinely perceive mind-independent objects without perceiving them by perceiving any "distinct and separate" entities (44). (Millar includes "separate" here to reconcile directness with the fact, as he sees it, that we see material objects by seeing their facing surfaces.) On the other hand, drawing a distinction due to Foster (2000), perception is psychologically mediated. When we perceive something, we do so in virtue of having an experience which is not itself a perception. Since we do not perceive experiences, this is quite consistent with perceptual directness. We thus arrive at a non-relational view on which the experiences we undergo in ordinary cases of veridical perception have no intrinsic connection to the object perceived and could be undergone even in hallucinations.

How do we get from experience to perception? According to Millar, you perceive an object just when it experientially orients you to its presence. Such orientation requires that the object elicits a largely matching experience which thereby places you to act in contextually appropriate ways with respect to it -- priming expectations of what it will do and placing you to avoid or engage it as befits your intentions. Experiential orientation is absent from cases of hallucination where there is no object to orient to. When hallucinating, a subject may at best "affect" (60) to act towards the apparent entity. This sophisticated causal theory makes no appeal to representational content.

Having sketched out his positive picture, Millar turns to criticizing naïve realism, and in particular two claims attributed to M. G. F. Martin. First, that reflection on the transparency of experience provides a reason for favoring relational views of perception. Second, that non-relational views of perception are committed to an immodest conception of experience. Martin's discussions of both topics are important but neglected. It is a shame that Millar's discussions are rare weak points.

First, take transparency. Millar claims that Martin "invokes the transparency of experience in support of the idea that relationalism . . . is the most natural way to characterize our perceptual experiences" (64). However, Millar quotes a long passage from Martin in which he writes that, in affirming the transparency of experience, "the Naïve Realist finds common ground with those views of perception which attribute to it a representational or intentional content and seek to explain its phenomenal character in terms of that content" (2004: 39). Clearly then Martin does not think that a simple appeal to transparency favors relational over non-relational views. Rather Martin takes transparency to be a datum in need of explanation, and grants that both intentionalists and naïve realists provide such an explanation. To find a datum which only relationalist views can adequately accommodate, Martin looks beyond a simple appeal to transparency to the connection between perceptual experience and sensory imagination (see Martin 2002). Millar does not mention this more elaborate thought. Instead, he bluntly insists that we should never expect introspective reflection on experience to support modally-involved claims about the metaphysics of experience. Doubtless, some readers will sympathize. However, it is incumbent on both them and Millar to engage with Martin's actual positive argument for such a modal claim.

Second, consider immodesty. Millar reads Martin as ascribing an immodest way of thinking about experience to non-relationalists in contrast to his own preferred relationalism. This can seem remarkable. Surely the bold modal commitments of relationalism are not modest. However, Millar misreads Martin. Martin does not accuse non-relationalists of immodesty. Nor does he claim that the modal commitments of relationalism are modest. Instead, following Hinton (1967), he claims modesty for a certain disjunctivist conception of experience and recommends that conception as the starting point for all theorists of perception -- each theorist incurring the obligation of explaining why we should move beyond it. According to this modest conception, experiences are episodes which are introspectively indiscriminable from veridical perceptions. Thus: "The notion of a visual experience of a white picket fence is that of a situation being indiscriminable through reflection from a veridical visual perception of a white picket fence as what it is." (2006: 363) Non-relationalists can happily embrace this neutral characterization.

Millar denies that any "neutral conception" (65) of experience is to be had, repeatedly declaring: "The very idea of experience is contested." This is puzzling. According to Millar, we can characterise experience using just-as-if descriptions of the following kind: "A visual experience of the sort produced by looking at a sunset is an experience such that it is just as if one is looking at a sunset" (70). Understood epistemically, this formulation seems close kin to Martin's on which the relevant kind are all those episodes which are indiscriminable through reflection from episodes of looking at a sunset. Why does Millar not see his own just-as-if conception as a suitable neutral starting point for philosophers of perception? My sense is that he cannot help but understand it as pushing us towards a common-factor approach. We are told that just-as-if characterisations "mesh well with how non-relationalists conceive of the individuation of experiences . . . in terms of their character," and thus that "we may regard experiences that are not different with respect to what could be characterized by just-as-if description as the same" (72). This of course takes us beyond a negative epistemic characterization to a metaphysical claim about common nature. The justification for doing so is obscure.

Millar's key idea about perceptual knowledge is that it is acquired by exercising perceptual recognitional abilities: abilities to know that something is some way based on its distinctive appearance. Ximena might, for instance, have the ability to recognize a bird as a quetzal based on its colourful look. To exercise such an ability involves the deployment of concepts. But such exercises may nonetheless be passive and "phenomenologically immediate" (79) reactions, including even to peripheral items.

For Millar, abilities are only ever exercised successfully. Thus, exercise of a recognitional ability guarantees knowledge. Mere experience as of a quetzal is insufficient for Ximena to exercise her ability. Instead, she must actually see a quetzal in suitable circumstances (good light, no salient decoys, etc.). Millar tells us not to expect any reductive story here. Nonetheless, he contends that explanations of knowledge acquisition in terms of the exercise of a recognitional capacity are informative and explanatory. They attribute to the knower a testable, general ability for knowing based on appearances across a range of circumstances (91). I would have valued more on this crucial point.

For Millar, recognitional judgements need not be well-founded or justified in the sense of being based on a propositionally-constituted reason which the subject possesses. Someone can know that p without having any reason to believe it. Such knowledge rests on their exercise of a recognitional capacity. For all that, the exercise of a recognitional capacity is a way of being rationally responsive to the world (110). Since this occurs only in the good case, there is a fundamental epistemological difference between seeing and hallucinating. Only when Ximena genuinely sees a quetzal is she rationally responsive to the presence of the quetzal and able to believe rightly. When hallucinating her judgement may be reasonable, but it is reasonable only because it is for her just as if she were genuinely seeing, and thereby rationally responding to, a quetzal.

Does this architecture satisfy Millar's ambition of vouchsafing our "common-sense thinking about perception and knowledge" (195)? Recall what I earlier described as a natural picture of perceptual knowledge on which conscious acquaintance explains how we come to know and think about aspects of the mind-independent world. Millar's problematic is to account for our rational responsiveness to the world despite our conscious perspective being exhausted by "sensory experiences that could have been as they are even if . . . there were no 'external world'" (194). His gambit is to deny that "all we have to go on" are experiences. Instead we have "what we perceive to be so" (195). Millar further contends that perceiving constitutes a genuinely "experiential awareness" (61) of mind-independent reality and is no "mere affectation of . . . subjectivity" (Putnam 1994: 454).

Millar justifies his claim that perceiving constitutes experiential awareness by appeal to his idea that you perceive an object just when it experientially orients you to its presence. It is doubtful that this is sufficient. Take veridical hallucinations (Lewis 1980). Millar dismisses such cases as involving "bizarre coincidence" (57). Yet whilst bizarre, they show that Millar's conditions for experiential orientation do not guarantee perception. In turn, this suggests that genuine perception cannot be understood in terms of conditions on experiences, when those experiences are conceived non-relationally. If that is right, Millar's perception-based explanations of knowledge will necessarily take us beyond our conscious perspective. This, relationalists will press, flouts common-sense thinking about perception and knowledge.

Late on, Millar replies to relationalists with a tu quoque.

The problem is not solved simply by invoking a relationalist account of perceptual experiences, since it needs to be explained how it can be that an experience consisting in being directly acquainted with an object could put us in a better position to know about that object than an experience that is indiscriminable from that experience but is not an episode of being acquainted with the object. (194)

However, the charge here is only compelling if we assume that indiscriminability is symmetric. Without symmetry, the naïve realist can insist that genuinely perceptual experiences are discriminable from matching hallucinations, though, of course, not vice-versa (cf. Martin 2006: 364, fn. 16). In this way, we can preserve the thought that the epistemological distinctiveness of perception flows entirely from its proprietary conscious character.


Thanks to Craig French, Anil Gomes and Matt Parrott for very helpful comments.


Eilan, N. 2001. Consciousness, acquaintance and demonstrative thought. Philosophy & Phenomenological Research 63(2): 433-440.

Foster, J. 2000. The Nature of Perception. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Hinton, J. M. 1967. Visual experiences. Mind 76: 217-227.

Lewis, D. 1980. Veridical hallucination and prosthetic vision. Australasian Journal of Philosophy 58: 239-49.

Martin, M. G. F. 2002. The transparency of experience. Mind & Language 17(4): 376-425.

Martin, M. G. F. 2004. The limits of self-awareness. Philosophical Studies 120: 37­-89.

Martin, M. G. F. 2006. On being alienated. In T. S. Gendler and J Hawthorne (eds.) Perceptual Experience. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 354-410.

Putnam, H. 1994. Sense, nonsense, and the senses: an inquiry into the power of the human mind. The Journal of Philosophy 91: 445-517.

Sosa, E. 2007. A Virtue Epistemology: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge, Volume I. Oxford: Clarendon Press.