Knowing Emotions: Truthfulness and Recognition in Affective Experience

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Rick Anthony Furtak, Knowing Emotions: Truthfulness and Recognition in Affective Experience, Oxford University Press, 2018, 248pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190492045.

Reviewed by Talia Morag, Deakin University


Rick Anthony Furtak presents a coherent and consistent "cognitive" view of emotions, whereby emotions are intentional and embodied states of mind, which give us epistemic access to aspects of the world that bear on our cares and concerns, thereby also enabling self-knowledge of what is significant to us. His book enjoys a density and breadth of references and influences. It is scientifically informed and up-to-date with the latest philosophical literature just as much as it is grounded in the history of philosophy, fruitfully engaging with both Anglo-American philosophy and Continental philosophy, in particular phenomenology and existentialism.

Furtak begins by opposing the "cognitive" theories of emotions, which argue that emotions are intentional and provide us information on what they are about, with feeling theories that give more weight to their somatic aspect. He claims that a theory of emotion need not prioritize one aspect over another but should accommodate both (a claim I shall cast some doubt on below). He acknowledges that not all theories neatly fit in those two groups (e.g. Ben-Ze'ev 2017), but his aim is to provide a theory that integrates cognition and feeling rather than merely combining them in a "hybrid" account. Part I is dedicated to articulating the view that emotions inform us about the world through our (somatic) feelings.

Furtak criticizes the tendency of philosophers to suppose that neuroscience has decided, or at least can decide, between those two approaches. Non-cognitivists often cite Joseph LeDoux's studies (1996), which, supposedly, show conclusively that there are two distinct routes in the brain that can cause fear -- one that involves the neocortex, and another that involves subcortical pathways. Since cognition is associated with cortical brain activity, non-cognitivists about emotions turn to these studies to claim that at least some if not all emotions are non-cognitive. Furtak shows, however, that the interpretation of these and other studies is still a matter of debate in the neuroscientific literature. This is an interesting fact, but Furtak's philosophical point is more compelling, namely that even if we could identify such distinct brain processes, we would still be at pains to claim that one is "cognitive" and the other "affective", since such an identification depends on our method of individuation of brain processes. This, in turn, depends on our conceptual understanding of emotions, which ultimately refers to self-reports about somatic feelings (and I would add observable behaviours) and the situational contexts of their occurrence, rather than to brain images (see also Nussbaum 2004) -- matters that allow for a plurality of interpretations.

It is disappointing, then, that Furtak does not abide by his own recommendation to avoid strong interpretations underdetermined by the data. He takes phenomenological arguments, which effectively rely on self-reports, about the involvement of both beliefs about the world and somatic feelings to indicate that cognition and affect "must" be intertwined (47). Must they? Why must fear be interpreted as "a felt apprehension of danger" (52); couldn't it just be an affect that is caused by something dangerous? -- and by "affect" I include not only embodied sensations but also action tendencies that are felt both physically and psychologically (Deonna and Teroni 2012), namely the motivational aspect of emotions -- something that Furtak hardly mentions. A cognitive theory hypothesizes one state with two aspects (affective and cognitive), and a feeling theory hypothesizes two states that are causally connected -- one cognitive and another affective, the latter being the affective core of what we normally call an "emotion". In fact, if we take the causal alternative over the constitutive one, then we need not say that emotions (or, rather, their affective cores) are intentional at all. They can be caused by an object in the environment, making it salient, without being "about" that object (Whiting 2011). We are told without argument that the alternative causal approach (versions of which can be found in, e.g., Prinz 2004; Harré 2009) is mistaken (47, 67). That we "must" interpret the data in terms of cognitive-affective intertwinement is never explained in the book, nor is it needed. It is already good news for cognitivism that the scientific and phenomenological data that Furtak considers does not contradict it.

This is only one "must" out of many that appear in the book where there is actually freedom of interpretation. Another prime example is Futrak's denial Part II, of "recalcitrant emotions", those emotions that persist despite the subject's own judgment against them (e.g., fear of a spider one judges to be harmless). The phenomenon has been traditionally taken to challenge the idea that emotions are rational (e.g., Brady 2009). But Furtak insists that such emotions show we are in an ambivalent state neither fully believing nor fully not-believing. If an emotion contradicts our avowed belief, he says, then we can conclude that there is something defective about this avowed belief. We are somehow not fully convinced of it and our misleadingly-called "recalcitrant" emotion reveals our wavering. Feeling and wholehearted belief go hand in hand, he claims, and we do not properly know anything without having our beliefs and feelings aligned.

That emotions are rational in this way, and that their divergence from our avowals indicates a state of in-between believing, is a possible interpretative route, familiar from discussions of implicit bias (Schwitzgebel 2010) -- which, as we can see in Furtak's examples, is a prime example of "recalcitrant" emotions. Furtak's interpretation of recalcitrance depends on construing the data in a certain theoretically-motivated way. The irrationalist or non-rationalist about emotions will take people's avowals that conflict with their emotions seriously and regard their plight when their emotion fails to subside as a riddle to be explained. Alternatively, the rationalist will see avowals that do not align with the appropriate feeling as defective, and the apparent confusion as bad faith. But why is the rationalist interpretation "more accurate" (62)? This claim is not argued for and is needlessly strong. All that Furtak is entitled to is that rationalism is a possible interpretative schema.

What follows from Furtak's claims is the cognitive view he endorses. To reconstruct or revise his argument: IF we only know something fully (e.g., that a loved-one died and how much that person means to us) when we experience the appropriate feeling (e.g., grief), IF the feeling aspect of emotions provides an apprehension of what various facts mean for us, a significance that would otherwise be inaccessible to us, THEN we can say that feelings are intentional, and that emotions track what Lazarus calls "core-relational themes". On such an account, emotions alert us to what is dangerous to us, or a loss for us, and (in general) what is significant to us. And this disclosure of aspects of the environment can be true or false. The conditional in my formulation above, however, is missing from the unnecessarily dogmatic formulations one can find in the book, its "musts" and "oughts" and "shoulds".

The idea that our avowals are wholehearted only when accompanied by the respective feeling also serves to reconstrue other familiar ordinary experiences, besides recalcitrance, where belief and emotion fail to align. A well-known challenge to this kind of rational cognitivism is what we can call the Emotionality Problem, traditionally posed for "judgmentalism" about emotions: if emotions are judgments, then how do we explain occasions where we judge that we have been wronged, say, but fail to be angry? As I have shown elsewhere (Morag 2016), the Emotionality Problem haunts all contemporary views of emotions which are invariably tracking views: if emotions track core-relational themes, then how do we explain occasions where we track dangers or losses but do not experience fear or grief? Furtak's answer is that these cases show that there is something defective about our tracking on these occasions. We actually have not univocally tracked those dangers and losses.

In the final part of the book, Furtak declares that in order to have emotional episodes, we must have background cares and concerns, which dispose us to emote in certain ways in certain circumstances. He calls it "the emotional a-priori". His articulation of this notion is indebted mainly to Scheler (also to Merleau-Ponty, Heidegger, and Kierkegaard). This is a felt dispositional background, since Furtak takes cares and concerns, loves and interests, to be long-standing and less conspicuous emotions. He turns to cases of people who experience "a general diminishment of emotional feeling" (119) and report seeing the world as unreal, strange, or artificial -- as evidence for the existence of the emotional a priori. But, once again, must we assume such an affective background of dispositions to emote as the condition of the possibility of emotions? We could, so it seems to me, conceive of emotions without it. We could see our cares and concerns as synoptic judgments that retroactively summarize or generalize over our history of emotional reactions rather than as generating these reactions (see an analogous argument against traits as dispositions that generate behaviour in Carruthers 2013). The uncanny character of reality experienced by people suffering from diminished affect could just be the strangeness of a life that stopped moving them emotionally. So I am not convinced we must interpret the data as demonstrating the kind of dispositions that Futrak and others envision (e.g., Roberts 1988).

Although the emotional a priori is a metaphysicalization of the familiar idea of care-dispositions as generating emotions, Furtak gives an unfamiliar and welcome emphasis to love, one that is often lacking from the philosophy of emotion. His discussion of love puts an interesting twist on his cognitive view. Since love is characterized by particularity and idiosyncrasy, that is, since each of us loves different people, ideas and things, loving them in our own way, then our loves make salient different aspects of people and things. Our emotional a priori, our attunement to what is significant to us, comprises our particular and idiosyncratic perspective on reality -- a perspective that is nevertheless objective, insofar as it perceives significances that are there to be perceived. Our emotions, according to this cognitive view, then, reveal different aspects of objective reality to different people and at the same time they also disclose our own distinctive values and sensibilities. For this love-centered view to count as cognitive, love cannot be a delusion or the result of "projections," whereby our perspective distorts or misconstrues reality. If love provides the conditions of the possibility of a tracking view, whereby emotions alert us to significant core-relational themes, then love itself has to be an emotion that reveals its object and its value rather than imagining or creating it. This notion of love as a genuine openness to the other is shared by philosophers that Furtak discusses (e.g. Frankfurt, Murdoch), and is presented as intertwined with the notion that love is selfless.

Furtak draws attention to the occasions where love surprises us to show that we encounter objective significance through love rather than project our familiar values on our loved-objects. But couldn't this surprise be otherwise explained? Perhaps our values are not so stable and predictable. And perhaps it is our own imagination that surprises us with new projections. And what about the familiar experience of having a series of romantic partners who seem similar to one another? Even if openness to the other as other is a worthy ideal, our talk about unhealthy patterns of relationships, of being attracted to, or attracting, certain "types", suggest that we "project" (see ourselves in the other) or "transfer" (see our past relationships in the other) or "idealize" (see what we would like to be or have in the other) all too often. One could still argue that even in those cases we identify what is there to be seen. Neither interpretation is forced on us by the data. It is worthwhile noting that while many see moods as distorting significances of objects and events, Furtak also sees them as truth revealing. Again, who is to say which interpretative framework is best?

Furtak's bi-directional tracking view, whereby emotions provide us simultaneously with knowledge of both external and internal reality, allows for the explaining away of certain cases of over-reaction. "Over-reactions" may be a misnomer and indicate that we do not fully know what matters to us, and that we should adjust our beliefs accordingly. But cases of genuine over-reactions, where our emotions fail to match our values, remain unexplained. In passing, Furtak also allows for over-reactions to indicate that we have misidentified the object of our emotions (e.g., it is not the minor misbehavior of our child that upsets us, but our general parent fatigue (194)). In such cases, he claims, the emotion still discloses something true. Yet, whatever the method of investigation that would lead us to the emotion's true object (or cause), that emotion has concealed rather than revealed this object (or cause). How can a tracking view deal with such cases, where no tracking has taken place? The same problem arises for objectless emotions (e.g., an unexplained anxiety attack) and for emotions about meaningless things (e.g., anger at a blunt pencil). These aspects of ordinary experience comprise an ongoing challenge for cognitive views of emotion. In fact, they may even cast doubt on the view that emotions track core-relational themes, especially given the plausibility of a non-cognitive view of love, moods, and recalcitrance (Morag 2017).

The book presents a richly articulated cognitive view of emotions that hangs together well and is consistent with the empirical data. Unlike other rationalist and cognitive accounts, this one does justice to the centrality of love in our lives, to the particularity and idiosyncrasy of our emotions as well as our endorsed values, and to the need we feel to negotiate occasions in which they conflict. The book's clarity of exposition and span of references, detailed in useful footnotes, make it ideal for teaching purposes as well. Its main problem, as I see it, is its dogmatic presentation, that does not appreciate the possibility or plausibility of a non-cognitive view that coheres equally well with the empirical data. The view presented rests on a vision of our emotional life as, by and large, straightforwardly providing us with important information about our environment and about our values. It is a rational vision of the soul, with a regulative ideal to have our emotions aligned with our avowed beliefs, and a moral ideal of love as a selfless relation to a genuinely different other. It is a vision that serves to interpret the data, from science and ordinary experience, but it is not determined by them. Furtak and his fellow rationalists are entitled to their interpretative schema. But so are non-cognitivists such as myself, with our entirely different vision of our emotional (or, better, affective) lives as non-rational, of people as irreparably conflicted and disunified, who are often unaware of their emotions and who can see others as genuinely different to themselves (or their parents or other figures from their past) only with great difficulty. When reading Furtak's book, I get the impression that he and I live in different worlds. I learned much from reading his compelling description of his rational world. But I am not convinced that we, non-cognitivists -- whose heritage includes Plato, Kant, Hume, Nietzsche, William James and, of course, Freud -- do not have the truer vision of the human condition.


Many thanks to Aaron Ben Ze'ev, Anthony Hatzimoysis, Demian Whiting, and especially David Macarthur for their comments.


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Brady, Michael S. 2009. "The Irrationality of Recalcitrant Emotions." Philosophical Studies 145: 3, 413-430.

Carruthers, Peter. 2013. "On knowing your own beliefs: A representationalist account." In N. Nottelmann (Ed.), New essays on belief: Constitution, content and structure (Palgrave MacMillan), 145-165.

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Harré, Rom. 2009. "Emotions as Cognitive-Affective-Somatic Hybrid," Emotion Review 1: 4, 294-301.

LeDoux, Joseph. 1996. The Emotional Brain (Simon and Schuster).

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-- . 2017. "The Tracking Dogma in the Philosophy of Emotion," Argumenta 2: 2, 343-464.

Nussbaum, Martha. 2004. "Emotions as Judgments of Value and Importance." In Robert Solomon (Ed.) Thinking about Feeling (Oxford University Press).

Prinz, Jesse J. 2004. Gut Reactions: A Perceptual Theory of Emotio. (Oxford University Press).

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Schwitzgebel, Eric. 2010. "Acting Contrary to Our Professed Beliefs or the Gulf between Occurrent Judgment and Dispositional Belief," Philosophical Quarterly 91, 531-553.

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