Knowing How: Essays on Knowledge, Mind, and Action

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John Bengson and Marc A. Moffett (eds.), Knowing How: Essays on Knowledge, Mind, and Action, Oxford University Press, 2011, 401pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195389364.

Reviewed by Erhan Demircioglu, University of Pittsburgh


The growing and well-deserved interest in the nature and grounds of knowledge-how in recent years is crowned with this excellent collection of original essays from some of the most able philosophers working in the field. The collection is balanced in two respects: it contains essays defending opposing accounts on knowledge-how, and it also contains essays that are devoted to delineating the broad implications and applications of taking a particular stand on the topic. All essays in the book are written with admirable clarity, awaken a desire to ponder the ongoing debates, and are rich in examples. The essays cover difficult topics, but they are rewarding, as one would expect from high quality works on a topic probing the intersection of knowledge, language, mind, and action.

The book opens with a long (52 pages) state-of-the-debate essay written by the editors, John Bengson and Marc A. Moffett. The length of the essay is consistent with, and justified by, its primary goal of providing an exhaustive outline of the central philosophical positions and questions about knowledge-how. Bengson and Moffett aim, among other goals, to make explicit the core contentions of the opposing views aptly named 'intellectualism' and 'anti-intellectualism' after Ryle's (1945) and (1949).  They also identify specific instances of these generic views, rehearse the now-standard arguments for and against, and gesture at the echoes that a philosophical theory of intelligence may generate in converging areas of inquiry.

The rest of the book is divided into four parts. Part I, "Ryle's Legacy," consists of two chapters -- one by Paul Snowdon and one by Jennifer Hornsby -- that evaluate Ryle's attack on intellectualism and his alternative conception of knowledge-how. Part II, "Philosophical Considerations," includes five chapters. Three of these chapters (by Yuri Cath, Berit Brogaard, and Bengson and Moffett) focus on the question whether knowledge-how is a species or kind of knowledge-that. The remaining two attempt to identify some issues that recent discussions of knowledge-how have ignored or overlooked: Julie Annas distinguishes between two kinds of knowledge-how, and Alva Noë discusses a "third realm" that lies between the entirely subjective realm of mere taste and the entirely objective realm of the rule-governed. Part III, "Linguistic Perspectives," brings together three essays, by Jonathan Ginzburg, David Braun, and Laura A. Michaelis, on the syntax and semantics of knowledge-how constructions and their relevance to the debate between intellectualism and anti-intellectualism. Part IV, "Implications and Applications," includes four chapters, by Katherine Hawley, Michael Tye, Michael Devitt, and Ian Rumfitt, discussing the significance of philosophical work on knowledge-how for ethics, philosophy of mind, philosophy of language, and philosophy of logic.

There is no essay in this collection that does not deserve wide notice and sustained study. Unfortunately, in a review of this length it is impossible to discuss all the essays with the depth of thought they themselves exhibit. In what follows I will examine some of the issues that I find especially interesting.

Let me start with what Snowdon calls "the central mystery of Ryle's approach" (67). The mystery is how to account for "the relation between the debate about intellectualism and the debate about the nature of know how" (67). Ryle's "Knowing How and Knowing That" opens with a preamble in which a doctrine he subsequently calls 'intellectualism' is characterized as the view that "intelligence concepts" such as "clever," "wise," "prudent," "sensible," and "skillful" are applied to practical actions in virtue of being accompanied by "internal acts of considering propositions" (Ryle 1945, 1). "What stands out is," as Snowdon observes, "that in the preamble Ryle never mentions know how" (62, emphasis original). Why is this? How does Ryle's attack on intellectualism sit with what he has to say about the relation between knowing how and knowing that?

This is not in fact much of a mystery if mysteries are supposed to be extremely resistant to a solution (or dissolution). What we have here is more like a puzzle crying for a substantial interpretation. Snowdon himself gives a brief sketch of a solution to the puzzle (67), and Bengson and Moffett provide a more detailed interpretation of how to understand how Ryle sees the bearing of his rejection of intellectualism on his thesis that knowing how cannot be defined in terms of knowing that (7-9, 19). The answer these three philosophers give to this question is basically that intellectualism is a general thesis about mind and action, a thesis which can be tested by evaluating one of its instances -- i.e., the idea that knowing how is a species of knowing that. On this approach, intelligence has many varieties, of which knowledge-how is merely an instance. If this is so, then if knowledge-how cannot be accounted for solely in terms of knowledge-that, then intellectualism fails.

An alternative approach to the puzzle would be to take Ryle as holding that having intelligence is having knowledge-how and also that intelligence concepts like "clever," "wise," and "acute," are disguised adverbs that qualify the object of knowledge-how in question. Some evidence for these two claims can be found, respectively, in the following passages:

When a person knows how to do things of a certain sort, we call him 'acute', 'shrewd', 'scrupulous' (Ryle 1945, 14).

Intelligently to do something . . . is not to do two things, one "in our heads" and the other perhaps in the outside world; it is to do one thing in a certain manner. It is somewhat like dancing gracefully (Ryle 1945, 3).

On this approach, "Michael is a wise chess player" can be read as expressing, roughly, that Michael knows how to play chess wisely, and "Michael is (now) wisely playing chess" can be read as expressing, roughly, that Mike's knowing how to play chess wisely is (now) actualized, given that on Ryle's view, knowledge-how is a disposition that may be actualized (1945, 14). I do not mean to suggest that this is the correct interpretation of how Ryle construes the relation between intelligence and knowledge-how, but only that this is one alternative interpretation.

Unfortunately, however, neither interpretation sits well with Ryle's main argument against intellectualism, namely, the famous regress argument. The problem is that the regress argument loses its spell when applied against the thesis that knowledge-how can be accounted for solely in terms of knowledge-that. Let me explain. Ryle's regress argument starts with asking the question what makes the supposedly intelligence-conferring "internal act of considering propositions" themselves intelligently performed. It seems that such an act must itself be intelligently performed because otherwise it does not appear to be capable of conferring intelligence to any practical action. However, if it is intelligently performed, then it appears that, according to intellectualism, there must be another internal act of considering a proposition which confers intelligence to the initial act in question. Since the same reasoning applies to this further internal act, a regress ensues.

Now suppose that what makes a practical action an exercise of knowledge-how (and what therefore makes it intelligent) is a piece of knowledge-that. If we attempt to apply the regress argument against this supposition, then we need to argue that the piece of knowledge-that in question must itself be "intelligently performed", which may possibly mean, for all I can see, that the belief which is a part of that piece of knowledge is justified. Now, of course, there is a good old epistemic regress problem with respect to the justification of our beliefs. But this is not a special problem for the intellectualist but a general problem for all philosophers of knowledge. If Ryle's regress argument against intellectualism reduces to a general epistemic regress problem when applied to the intellectualist-looking thesis that knowledge-how is to be accounted for solely in terms of knowledge-that, then it does not have any special force against that thesis. However, Ryle's regress argument is designed to have such a special force against intellectualism. So, what is thought to count against intellectualism cannot, by itself, be supposed to count against the thesis in question. This implies that the relation between intellectualism and the alleged intellectualist-looking thesis is harder to specify than what the above interpretations suggest. So, the puzzle appears to remain unsolved.

Let me now turn to a related topic, the question whether knowledge-how is a species of knowledge-that. Jason Stanley and Timothy Willamson (2001) made a strong case for the thesis that knowledge-how is "simply a species of propositional knowledge" (441). Cath, in his essay in this collection, provides some persuasive reasons against this thesis. He argues that knowledge-that is typically or standardly taken to be subject to some conditions which knowledge-how need not satisfy, such as the anti-luck condition, the (undefeated) justification condition, and the belief condition. So, there are cases where knowledge-how and knowledge-that come apart.

To get a sense of Cath's arguments, consider his "Lucky Light Bulb" case. Charlie wants to learn how to change a light bulb and consults a copy of The Idiot's Guide to Everyday Jobs. However, unbeknownst to Charlie, all the copies of the book except his are filled with misleading instructions, and Charlie is extremely lucky to have the accurate one. Charlie reads his copy and grasps the instructions therein perfectly. So, there is a way, call it 'w1', such that Charlie now believes that w1 is a way for him to change a light bulb. Intuitively, Charlie now knows how to change a light bulb but he does not know that w1 is a way for him to change the light bulb. This is because Charlie's belief is only accidentally true: Charlie could have easily bought a copy filled with misleading instructions and thus have easily come to believe something false about ways of changing a light bulb. However, Charlie's being epistemically lucky with respect to the truth of his belief about w1 does not seem to be a reason to think he thereby fails to possess the corresponding knowledge-how.

This is a beautiful and strong argument. I am inclined to think that it shows what it is intended to show: that knowledge-how is not subject to some constraints that are traditionally associated with knowledge-that. If that is so, then it seems that there are two options for the intellectualist: either to argue that there is a kind of knowledge-that that is not subject to the traditional constraints mentioned above and that knowledge-how is a species of this non-traditional kind of knowledge-that, or to maintain that traditional constraints hold for all cases of knowledge-that and to retreat to a somewhat weaker intellectualist thesis that knowledge-how is a matter of standing in an intentional relation to a proposition other than the knowledge-that relation. Cath provides a sketch for the latter, while Brogaard argues for the former in her contribution to the volume. Unfortunately for the intellectualist, neither option appears to be promising. Let me first say a couple of things about Cath's suggestion, and then I will turn to Brogaard's account.

Cath offers the following "seeming analysis" of knowledge-how:

S knows how to Φ if, and only if, there is some way w to Φ such that:

(a) S stands in the seeming relation to the proposition that w is a way to Φ, and

(b) S entertains the proposition that way w is a way to Φ under a practical mode of presentation (133).

The notion of "a practical mode of presentation" is adapted from Stanley and Willamson's proposal on knowledge-how, and let us not worry about what it is. The "seeming" relation in question is, Cath takes it, different from believing. "It can seem to one," Cath says, "that p even when one fails to believe that p" (133). Let us also not worry whether there is indeed such a propositional attitude that is considerably weaker than believing. What is striking about Cath's proposal is that nothing on the right-hand side of the biconditional appears to be capable of accounting for, or amounting to, knowledge. If knowledge-how is a form of knowledge, and if no form of knowledge can be accounted for by the relations of seeming (which is weaker than believing) and entertaining under a practical mode of presentation, then Cath's proposal appears to be inadequate. The problem is not merely that, on Cath's proposal, there is no mention of traditional conditions for knowledge such as justification and belief. After all, Cath's primary aim in his paper is to show that those conditions need not be satisfied by knowledge-how. The problem is that what is offered in place of those constraints does not even come close to being able to provide a plausible analysis of any form of knowledge, let alone, in our case, of knowledge-how.

Cath's proposal is perhaps, as Brogaard suggests, that 'know' "ambiguously denot[es] sometimes a knowledge state and sometimes an intellectual seeming state" (145). If this is the correct reading of Cath's proposal, then it is also not without problems. First, I do not think there are any convincing reasons to think that when 'know' is followed by 'that' and 'how', it turns out to have different meanings, namely, knowing and seeming, respectively. 'Know' appears to uniquely denote one kind of state, however the nature of that state is cashed out and even though the object it takes on different occasions may differ in kind (e.g., a proposition, an ability, or an individual). Notice that there are knowledge-wh constructions such as 'know why', 'know where', and 'know when', as well as constructions like 'know that' and 'know how'. Are we to say, following Cath's proposal, that 'know' denotes different states in these constructions?

Second, if 'knowledge-how' were to denote seeming (under a practical mode of presentation), then it would be impossible to have seeming without knowledge-how. But it appears that there are such cases. Consider Susan, who is an anxious driver who gets overexcited and loses control whenever she tries to parallel park her car. It is the same story each time: her car is tired of the accidents Susan has every time she tries to parallel park it. This is so despite the fact that Susan took every theoretical and practical lesson from the best drivers available in the country. Now, there appears to be some way w to parallel park Susan's car such that Susan stands in the seeming relation (under a practical mode of presentation) to the proposition that w is a way to parallel park her car. Yet, intuitively, Susan does not know how to parallel park her car (as the numerous accidents she has had bear witness). If that is so, then knowledge-how and seeming (under a practical mode of presentation) may come apart, which implies that knowledge-how is not seeming.

Let me now turn to Brogaard's account of knowledge-how, which offers a radical reconceptualization of knowledge-that. Brogaard argues that there are primitive knowledge-that states that are not belief entailing and also that some knowledge-how states are primitive non-belief entailing knowledge-that states:

If s knows how to A but does not have a belief to the effect that doing P1, P2, P3, . . . in S is a way for s to A, then it is plausible that s, at least at some level of information processing, has information to the effect that doing P1, P2, P3, . . . in S is a way for s to A" (155, emphasis mine).

The following quotation succinctly captures her main thesis:

If s is in an ability state with the content of 'doing P1, P2, P3, . . .,  in S is a way for s to A', and ability states are knowledge states, then there is a way w (namely, doing P1, P2, P3, . . . in S) such that s knows that w is a way for s to A. For example, it is plausible that my hamster Harry is in an ability state with the representational content of 'doing P1, P2, P3, . . . , in S is a way for me to find my food bowl.' So if ability states are knowledge states, then there is a way w such that my hamster Harry knows that w is a way for him to find his food bowl (157).

Brogaard's discussion of the relation between ability and knowledge-how is not as clear as one would like, but she appears to assume, with some plausibility, that the ability to A is to know how to A. According to Brogaard, her hamster Harry's knowledge-how can be thought of as incorporating pieces of knowledge-that even if he fails to have the relevant beliefs, insofar as he can be plausibly attributed a representational state carrying the relevant information processed at some level. Brogaard provides some arguments to the effect that such an attribution is plausible, and accordingly concludes that intellectualism buttressed with a novel conception of knowledge-that is not threatened by the possibility of knowledge-how states that are not accompanied by relevant beliefs.

There are, I think, many problems with Brogaard's overall account. I will mention only one of them that appears to me especially important. I see no reason why the anti-intellectualist as such should deny that having knowledge-how is accompanied by or even requires having an information-carrying state at some level. It seems reasonable to attribute some information-carrying states at some level to creatures with certain abilities that are not capable of having beliefs (just as, for instance, it seems reasonable to attribute some information-carrying states at some level to creatures with certain perceptual capacities that are not capable of having beliefs). Brogaard's hamster Harry's feet may be thought of as carrying the information at some level that the grass is wet; his retinas may be thought of as carrying the information at some level that his master is coming towards him; his ears may be thought of as carrying the information at some level that a cat nearby is meowing; and so on. These pieces of information are processed at a sub-personal level in that they are not access-conscious (Block 1998). But do the commitments of the anti-intellectualist include claims such as that when a subject has knowledge-how, there are no states at any level that can be plausibly thought of as carrying information?  Surely not. Or, if yes, anti-intellectualism is much stronger (and much more implausible) than what it is generally taken to be, and intellectualism comes close to being a truism.

So, anti-intellectualism is either the thesis that when a subject knows how to do something, there are no representational contents at any levels of processing, or the thesis that when a subject knows how to do something, there are no representational contents that are processed at the level of believing. The former thesis is very strong and (almost) surely false, and it cannot be what has given rise to so much controversy. However, if it is the latter thesis, then, as Brogaard acknowledges (150), Cath's Jodie case (116) appears to have devastating implications against intellectualism. So, either intellectualism is (almost) surely true but uninteresting, or it is interesting but faces serious difficulties.

On the whole, Knowing How is an excellent collection from some exceptional philosophers. This is not a book for a small group of philosophers interested in some distant and specialized field. It is a book on the very central areas of philosophy, and thus there is something thus useful for all serious philosophers. The wealth of its perspectives and accounts is not merely a blessing but also a nightmare for the reviewer. This review would deem itself successful if it managed to raise some worries and questions in a way to stimulate further discussion.


Block, N. 1998. On a confusion about a function of consciousness. In N. Block, O. Flanagan, G. Guzeldere. The nature of consciousness: philosophical debates. MIT Press: 375-415.

Ryle, G. 1945. Knowing how and knowing that. Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 46: 1-16.

Ryle, G. 1949. The concept of mind. Chicago: Chicago University Press.

Stanley, J., and T. Williamson. 2001. Knowing how. Journal of Philosophy, 98: 411-444.