Knowing Other Minds

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Anita Avramides and Matthew Parrott (eds.), Knowing Other Minds, Oxford University Press, 2019, 238pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198794400.

Reviewed by Amy Kind, Claremont McKenna College


Many of us have spent a considerable amount of 2020 working and teaching in a much more solitary environment than we're used to. Rather than conversing with one another in person, we are instead spending hours and hours staring at one another arranged in little boxes on a computer screen, listening to disembodied voices through our hastily acquired headsets, and attempting to form some kind of meaningful human connection. Yet even in these strange and difficult days of the COVID-19 era, when so much of our interaction with other people is virtual, we still take it completely for granted that this virtual interaction puts us in contact with actual other people and, correspondingly, with actual other minds. Moreover, we generally take ourselves to know quite a bit about the other minds with which we're interacting. We can typically tell when someone with whom we're interacting is frustrated or furious, when they're happy or when they're hurting. As co-editor Matthew Parrott says in his introductory chapter, "We normally take ourselves to know what other people think, feel, or want, and we rely on this knowledge in our actions and interactions." (p. 1) But even if it seems beyond reasonable doubt that we have knowledge of other minds, philosophers have traditionally taken this knowledge to be puzzling, i.e., puzzling in a way that sets it apart from other kinds of knowledge that we have. In this volume, the editors have assembled ten high quality and thought-provoking contributions that address the family of puzzles that underlie our knowledge of other minds.

The volume begins with two contributions (one by Parrott and one by Paul F. Snowdon) that attempt to tease apart these puzzles, puzzles that have often been jointly referred to as the problem of other minds. In the first of these two contributions, Parrott distinguishes three different problems: what he terms the epistemological, the conceptual, and the processing problems. The epistemological problem asks how we are able to have knowledge of other minds. How are we able to know anything about the mental lives of others, indeed, how are we even able to know that they have mental lives? The conceptual problem, arising largely out of the work of Wittgenstein, asks how we can apply the same mental state concepts both to our own minds and to the minds of others. Finally, the processing problem explores what psychological processes and mechanisms are responsible for our attributions of mental states to others and our capacity to predict and explain their behavior in light of these attributions. This last problem is often referred to as the theory of mind debate, a debate between the theory theory and the simulation theory that was especially prominent in the 1980s and 1990s. Though these three problems may seem to be largely distinct from one another, Parrott goes on to argue that they are importantly connected.

After the initial two chapters that provide an overview of the problem of other minds, the breakdown of the contributions is as follow. Three of the papers -- by Shaun Gallagher and Anika Fiebich, Pierre Jacob, and Søren Overgaard -- focus on the processing problem. None of the papers focuses on the conceptual problem, though it is discussed in Snowden's chapter (see especially pp. 29-35) and Jane Heal describes herself as operating roughly within its framework (see pp. 201-2). The rest of the contributions, four in total, focus on the epistemological problem. The emphasis on this problem is perhaps not surprising given that it might be reasonably characterized as the traditional focus of the problem of other minds, but given the framing of Parrott's introduction, one might have expected more balanced attention to each of the three problems that he distinguishes.

Attempts to address the epistemological problem have traditionally fallen into two categories -- those that claim that our knowledge of other minds is based on inference and those that claim that our knowledge of other minds is based on perception. Åsa Wikforss's contribution falls into the first category. The epistemological problem arises, at least in part, because of an apparent asymmetry between the way that we know about our own mental states and the way that we know about the mental states of others: While we can know about our own mental states directly, simply in virtue of experiencing them, our knowledge of other people's mental states seems to be based on an inference from their behavior. On Wikforss's view, however, the asymmetry is considerably less strong than many have thought. The defense of this claim consists largely in developing a better understanding of the kind of justification underlying self-knowledge -- and to my mind, it's this discussion of self-knowledge that constitutes the main interest of Wikforss's discussion. Focusing primarily on the case of belief, Wikforss argues that our self-knowledge is best understood as having not only an experiential basis but also an inferential basis. Drawing on empirical evidence regarding choice blindness as well as recent work in developmental psychology, Wikforss defends a version of inferentialism about self-knowledge of beliefs, according to which our justification for our self-ascription of beliefs relies on various kinds of evidence, most notably behavioral evidence, in addition to whatever experiential evidence is available. Since this experiential evidence is typically fairly weak with respect to beliefs, the asymmetry between first- and third-person knowledge does not seem to be something that should raise significant worries: "The grounds for scepticism when it comes to knowledge of the beliefs of others are therefore not much stronger than the grounds for scepticism when it comes to knowledge of our own beliefs." (p. 62) But insofar as Wikforss's discussion accepts a stronger epistemic asymmetry with respect to sensations (see p. 60), the worries underlying the epistemological problem are not here laid fully to rest.

The other three papers addressing the epistemological problem fall into the second category, i.e., they take up perceptual accounts of our knowledge of other minds. Here it's worth noting that one of the papers on the processing problem, the contribution by Overgaard, also focuses on a perceptual account, what he calls social perception theory; but he is concerned with this theory as a theory of mindreading and not as a theory of the justification we have for our beliefs about the mental states of others. Of the three papers addressing the perceptual account in the context of the epistemological problem, the first is Anita Avramides's contribution. Avramides focuses on Fred Dretske's perceptual account of self-knowledge, and she ends up with a pessimistic assessment, dismissing it as too simplistic. Anil Gomes' contribution offers us an account that builds on many of the insights of the perceptual account but offers an alternative to it. While perceptual accounts typically claim that our knowledge of others' minds is based on their expressive behavior, Gomes' denies that this is best understood as a kind of knowledge that is perceptual in nature. Rather, he suggests that we should see it as a sui generis kind of knowledge, what he calls expressive knowledge, that is neither evidential nor perceptual. William E. S. McNeill's contribution offers a defense of the perceptual account against the kind of expressive account offered by Gomes. Though he accepts the intuitive appeal of an expressive account and accepts that expressive behavior plays an important role in our social interactions with one another, he takes our knowledge of other minds to be more direct than such an account would allow.

As these papers by Gomes and McNeill present sharply contrasting views -- perhaps the clearest example of such a direct contrast in the volume as a whole -- I will here focus on them in slightly more detail in an effort to assess the state of this particular debate. Consider a standard kind of case in which we might take ourselves to have knowledge of other minds. I come across a friend whom I have known for quite a long time. She is smiling and laughing. I judge that she is happy. What justifies me in this judgment? In particular, what role do the smiling and laughing play?

On Gomes' view, my knowledge that she is happy is gained on the basis of her smiling and laughing behavior, behavior that serves as an expression of her mental state. The notion of expression is a technical one for Gomes. Though expressive behavior can come apart from the mental state it purports to express (as in cases of mimickry), expressions cannot. Rather, expressions are metaphysically dependent on the mental states they express, i.e., "the expression obtainsin virtue of the mental phenomenon in question." (p. 169) Moreover, Gomes argues that because our recognitional capacities do not track mental phenomena on the basis of their appearance but rather track expressions of mentality on the basis of their appearance, this expressive knowledge is non-perceptual.

McNeill disagrees. On his view, I do directly perceive my friend's happiness. Though of course I see her smile and hear her laughing, I don't judge that she is happy on the basis of the smile and laughter. I can just tell that she is happy. He makes this case by asking us to compare three different cases. In the first, we see a friend smiling and laughing and know that she is happy. In the second, we see a friend smiling and laughing but find ourselves unconvinced that she is happy; we know that something is wrong. And in the third, we see a friend who is neither smiling nor laughing, but we nonetheless know that she is happy -- there is just "something about her" that enables us to tell. (p. 192) Thus, since expressive behavior comes apart from the relevant mental states, since it "is possible for only one of a pair of visual duplicates to be happy," our knowledge should not be understood as being based on the expressive behavior. (p. 196) Though our knowledge of the mental lives of others is often mediated by that behavior, the knowledge that we have outstrips our awareness of the behavior.

I have had to be far too quick with these summaries, and thus some of the nuances of Gomes' and McNeill's arguments have been lost, but I'm hopeful that I have nonetheless been able to make clear the point at issue between them. To put it in terms of Gomes' terminology, McNeill denies Gomes' claim that mental phenomena really have expressions. How should we adjudicate this debate? I confess that I came away without a clear sense of which side has the stronger case. Ultimately, I found something unsatisfactory about the arguments on both sides.

On the one hand, I found it enormously difficult to understand exactly what expressive knowledge was meant to be, and it's hard not to see its invocation as somewhat ad hoc. I found it similarly difficult to accept that the notion of expression could do the explanatory work that Gomes needs it to. Perhaps we might say something like the following: Only when the expressive behavior is indeed an expression can we be justified in our judgments about, and hence have knowledge of, others' mentality. But since we have no way of telling when expressive behaviors are in fact expressions, we have no way of telling when our judgments about other minds constitute knowledge. And this seems implausible. We might not always know this, but surely we often do.

On the other hand, I was not convinced that matters were quite as straightforwardly perceptual as McNeill would have us believe. Even if we accept his claim that sometimes there is just something about a person that enables us to tell that they are happy, even when they are not smiling or laughing or producing any behavior normally expressive of happiness, that falls far short of the claim that we see that they are happy, i.e., that our knowledge is perceptual. Other explanations here seem possible. To give just one example: Perhaps there is some kind of mirror neuron activity on which this knowledge is based. (In this case, I suppose we would be making a sort of inference, though perhaps an unconscious one.)

But even though I was not fully convinced by either of these papers, I learned quite a bit from engaging with them and, more generally, with the volume as a whole. One might raise some quibbles about the volume's organizational structure. For example, one might have expected from Parrott's introduction that there would be roughly equal sections on each of the three problems that he delineated, or at least that the papers would be divided into sections according to the framing that he provided. Instead, that framing seems somewhat distinct from the way the contributions actually proceed, both in terms of the order in which they're presented in the volume (for example, given that Overgaard's contribution addresses the processing problem, it's puzzling that it is separated from the other two papers addressing this) and in terms of the issues that are front and center in the discussions themselves. As a result, the volume feels somewhat less cohesive than one might have liked. But these are all minor issues, and they should not be given undue weight. All of the contributions are of uniformly high quality, and the editors are to be commended for that. Perhaps most importantly, it's clear that any reader interested in learning about the current state of play in the other minds debate will benefit from reading the volume.