Knowing Otherwise: Race, Gender, and Implicit Understanding

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Alexis Shotwell, Knowing Otherwise: Race, Gender, and Implicit Understanding, The Pennsylvania State University Press, 2011, 180pp., $54.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780271037639.

Reviewed by Anne Jaap Jacobson, University of Houston


Alexis Shotwell's book presents a complex account of the workings of our minds that are largely or even completely outside our awareness. A central aim in doing so is to explain the possibility of change that is potentially revolutionary, both in ourselves and in society. This very original work nonetheless draws on many traditional sources and the result is a quite dense volume, one that is difficult to summarize in a review. I am going to start by locating Shotwell's work with reference to recent discussions of implicit understanding to show what is, I think, an important addition she makes to perhaps more familiar work on implicit bias. I will then turn to the work directly and try to pick out particularly important points made in its chapters. I will close with some critical notes. It is not clear that we have enough well-grounded theories to provide all the background she needs. But if there is a lack here, the book points us toward an important area of inquiry that is insufficiently explored.

Suppose, for example, that in one particular year the only invited speakers a philosophy department is hosting are white men. One explanation might appeal to wide-spread general conscious beliefs in the department that men of color or women cannot do philosophy. Hopefully, however, that sort of phenomenon is now rare, and other explanations are more likely. Among these other explanations, one could appeal to an unconscious association between being an able philosopher and being a white male. And the cause here may be just the fact that the majority of able philosophers one encounters are white men. The bias may be outside of one's awareness and acted on without any knowledge on one's part. It seems, then, to fall outside moral evaluation. Among the agreeable results of such an account is the fact that one does not have to go around labeling people horrible bigots when one proposes changing their ways of asking speakers.

Such biases may result in women receiving lower grades in classes and black men being sentenced to death much more often than white, but none of that makes the responsible people bad people, as is often implied. However, reading Shotwell's book presents one with reasons for thinking we need to do a much more careful job of asking ourselves about the impact of implicit bias concerning race or gender on something like the character or 'quality of person' of its possessors. What does become clear is that a person who is generally implicitly biased against members of a group has a different way of being in a society containing the objects of bias from someone who is not so biased or is at least actively resisting the pull of such biases.

Shotwell distinguishes four kinds of implicit understanding:

  1. Practical, skill-based understanding, which is developed through practice. This is a knowledge that consists in the ability to do certain things. Hubert Dreyfus brought this knowledge to many philosophers' attention, though, arguably, Gilbert Ryle along with others also singled it out.
  2. Somatic or bodily knowing. Shotwell sees this as knowledge had at the intersection of bodily and conceptual systems. It is our felt experience of embodiment, which brings together material realities and social worlds. Thus, feeling like a girl is complexly social and relational.
  3. The third kind of implicit understanding encompasses the potentially propositional; it is knowledge that could be put into words but has not been. It is what we count as "common sense," and often does not need to be said. According to Shotwell, this understanding may provide us with foundations.
  4. "The category of affect and feeling can be understood as a kind of implicit understanding, not fully or generally propositional or considered a kind of knowledge" (p. xii).

In Chapter One, we get a fuller picture of these kinds of implicit understanding. Shotwell sees these categories as interacting to provide the background in place for our conscious propositional thoughts. One way to see the importance of implicit understanding in constituting the kind of person one is comes with seeing the difference between the Rawlsian decision maker and the person as implicitly understanding. Rawls' decider must have comprehensive information, but this will be what is expressed in propositional knowledge. Following Susan Babbitt's work, we can see this leaves out the implicit knowledge that "'people possess in the form of intuitions, attitudes, ways of behaving, orientation and so on'" (Babbitt 1996, p. 50; quoted on p. 6).

The second category: drawing on Bourdieu (Baron-Cohen, Lutchmaya, and Knickmeyer 2004), Shotwell points out that our embodied social sense encodes many of the values of our society; seemingly innocuous details can embody a whole history. The body can enact the past.

In picking up the third category, Shotwell takes racial, gender and class prejudices to be usually literally pre-judgmental, that is, implicit and only potentially propositional. This is a surprising view. It may be argued that there is a lot of explicit prejudice that people may write whole books to express, or give speeches about. At the same time, it seems a bit odd to think that prejudice cannot be like an emotion, for example, disgust, a visceral aversion. This latter objection seems to be less telling than the former point; disgust may be an aspect of a prejudice that has a propositional form (p. 43).

Shotwell's discussion of affect takes up the valuable anti-individualism of Sue Campbell. Conventions in our society can constrain what emotions can be felt. Feelings "surf the edge" of an experience which is both personal and collaborative. They come into fuller being as they are recognized.

Chapter Two picks up on the question of how common sense transmits racial and gender attitudes. Covering a number of important theorists, Shotwell also takes on the very important topic of the epistemology of ignorance. Racism and sexism are sustained in part by what is counted as not needing to be known.

Chapter Three is both rich and problematic. Given the view that prejudices exist in this rich interlocking network of kinds of implicit understanding, change seems to require finding ways to transform that world. Since it is not conscious and explicitly propositional, we need to look to ways other than logical argumentation. Chapter Three is largely about the promise art offers to those looking at how to transform society.

A problem arises: the text does contain very compelling pictures of how art can transform. Unfortunately, there is no appeal to anything empirical to show that art actually does transform many people's views. There is also an unfortunately strong argument against the idea. That is, a very great deal of art is hidden away in what are regarded as elitist institutions. One possible explanation of the exclusionary settings is just that art does not resonate with most people. While I do not want to endorse such a view, we do need empirical information about the actual effects of art, as opposed to the effects theorists ascribe to it.

Chapter Four has one of the most important discussions in the book, a quite illuminating discussion of the difference between shame and guilt, and most particularly white shame and guilt. One large problem for any attempt to engage white people in anti-racist actions is that white people can end up still occupying the foreground of everyone's attention. Shotwell makes a strong case for the relevance of distinguishing between shame and guilt for solving such problems.

Chapters Five and Six bring earlier themes to bear on new topics. Chapter Five concerns working in solidarity to advance an anti-racist agenda with people whose common sense is different from one's own. If we look at Chapter Six in light of the recent stress on embodiment in philosophy of mind, we can get a clear sense of how much further along Shotwell's work is. While philosophers of mind are struggling with whether our bodies are essential to our conscious cognition, Shotwell is writing about how the social embeddedness of our variously gendered bodies is an important factor in implicit understanding. Many recent philosophers might respond that Shotwell is still talking about causation and not the constitution of our understanding, where the constitution claim is seen as the goal of the embodiment theorist. However, once we reflect on the varieties of implicit understanding, the idea that one's sexed and gendered body has a constitutive role in some aspects of our implicit understanding looks like a stronger claim for embodiment than many that appear in more mainstream discussions.  As Shotwell quotes Avery Gordon: "sensuous knowledge always involves . . . doing " (Gordon 1997, p. 205; quoted on p. 127). One's body may be essential to the implicit understanding one has.

There is much more that could be said about the content of the book, but I want to turn to a different topic that presents a problem for Shotwell's project right now. The book is replete with causal claims, from ones we have noticed about the effects of art to others about why we can feel shame for someone badly misbehaving (p. 79). In the latter case, we have learned that we can feel deep identification with the actions of others by doing something like involuntarily "mirroring" them in our minds (Iacoboni 2008). Once we bring in an understanding of an almost omnipresent capacity for reenacting others' actions in our minds, the role Shotwell assigns to shame appears tangential. We have a deep capacity for identifying. Perhaps shame helps to turn that capacity into thoughts about shameful inequalities. But if it does, its role is not correctly described on p. 79, which appears not to consider at all the research surrounding our brain-based capacities for identifying with the actions of others.

I think philosophers of many stripes should be worried by the sort of objection I have just brought. We became aware in the seventeenth century that there is at least a problem in thinking that our sensory experience reveals in any direct way the causal structure of our environment. We are now learning that self-reflection and even careful observation may fail to reveal the causal structure of our minds. A major lesson, perhaps starting with the early work of Kahneman and Tversky (Kahneman 2002), but greatly amplified by recent cognitive psychology and neuroscience (Chabris and Simons 2010, Montague 2007, Wilson and Bar-Anan 2008), is that we really are often not cognitively what we think we are. If that is true, there is a problem with our adopting philosophical positions based on introspection and careful observation of others. We may be quite unable to detect errors that nonetheless are there. Extensive agreement with an analysis is not confirmation of it.

The solution to the problem here does not reside, I think, in jettisoning philosophy; rather, we need to work more closely with the causal sciences of the mind. Shotwell, read in this context, points to a need to connect the humanities and the sciences as we try to understand how to get ourselves and others to behave better. Neither may give us the answers we need without the other.


Babbitt, Susan E. 1996. Impossible dreams: rationality, integrity, and moral imagination. Boulder, Colo.: Westview Press.

Baron-Cohen, Simon, Svetlana Lutchmaya, and Rebecca Knickmeyer. 2004. Prenatal testosterone in mind: amniotic fluid studies. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.

Chabris, Christopher F., and Daniel J. Simons. 2010. The invisible gorilla: thinking clearly in a world of illusions. New York: Crown Publishers.

Gordon, Avery. 1997. Ghostly matters: haunting and the sociological imagination. Minneapolis; London: University of Minnesota Press.

Iacoboni, Marco. 2008. Mirroring People: The New Science of How We Connect with Others. New York: Farrar, Straus and Giroux.

Kahneman, Daniel. 2002. Maps of Bounded Rationality

Montague, Read. 2007. Your brain is (almost) perfect: How we make decisions. New York: Penguin Group.

Wilson, Timothy D., and Yoav Bar-Anan. 2008. PSYCHOLOGY: The Unseen Mind. Science 321 (5892):1046-1047.