Knowing Our Limits

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Nathan Ballantyne, Knowing Our Limits, Oxford University Press, 2019, 326pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190847289.

Reviewed by Jeremy Fantl, University of Calgary


Roderick Chisholm took the purpose of raising traditional epistemological questions to be

to correct and improve our own epistemic situation . . . to do our best to improve our set of beliefs -- to replace those that are unjustified by others that are justified and to replace those that have a lesser degree of justification with others that have a greater degree of justification. (1989, 1)

Chisholm is the final philosopher referenced at the end of the last chapter of Nathan Ballantyne's wonderful and challenging book, and the second referenced in the first chapter (after John Locke).

The book aims to go some distance toward achieving Chisholm's purpose by engaging in regulative epistemology -- "the kind of epistemology that aims to provide guidance for inquiry," (2) rather than simply detailing necessary and sufficient conditions for S to know that p or trying to answer Cartesian skepticism. Unlike other regulative epistemologists, Ballantyne does not disparage non-regulative projects. Instead, he thinks that results in non-regulative epistemology have lessons for guiding inquiry, as do results in non-philosophical fields like cognitive science. He introduces us to regulative epistemology in the first chapter and traces its historical antecedents in the second.

Ballantyne's contribution to regulative epistemology is the development of a set of principles (called "the method") for approaching controversial beliefs and deciding whether and how to revise them. For these principles to achieve the goals of regulative epistemology, they have to stand a chance at guiding action and inquiry. Ballantyne argues for the possibility of doing so in the third chapter, noting that in order for principles to be effective, it takes practice and work to ensure that the principles are encoded in our more automatic processing systems. Cognitive science will be useful in determining how to do this.

The method, Ballantyne claims, is revisionary in three ways: "In order to bring our inquiry into step with the method, some of our important beliefs, our belief-forming habits, and our attitudes toward inquiry must change" (270). Much of the book argues for the first of these ways: the method requires revision of our controversial beliefs.

Revision is required because we should be more open to the possibility that we're in error, which itself often requires us to reduce confidence. At various points Ballantyne insists he is not arguing for a skeptical conclusion, though he notes that he took an early misstep when writing the book by conceiving of it as a skeptical treatise. Still, there is no denying that Ballantyne takes it that the method is likely to drive many to a more skeptical posture than they might have initially taken. If we accept his method, we will often be forced to revise many of our controversial beliefs downward.

His more skeptical arguments are presented in Chapters 5-9, and all follow a similar pattern:

P1) Phenomenon X often presents us with defeaters for our controversial beliefs.

P2) We often have no defeaters for those defeaters.


C) Our controversial beliefs are often unreasonable.

Each chapter is devoted to discussion of a different "Phenomenon X."

For example, in Chapter 5 Ballantyne concerns himself with what he calls, in accordance with the philosophical literature, the "Problem of Peer Disagreement." In many cases, peer disagreement presents a defeater for our controversial beliefs. We know that people just as competent and well-informed as we are disagree with us about whether, say, raising the minimum wage will increase unemployment in some specific instance. This is at least a prima facie defeater for our belief because, in the absence of some reason to think they are less reliable than we are, it looks like we should be less confident.

This isn't the end of the matter, because we may very well have some defeater-defeater -- some reason to think that their opinion does not carry much evidential weight (for example, that they are more biased than we are). But, Ballantyne argues, we shouldn't hold out too much hope. One reason is that we tend to underestimate the possibility and extent of our own lack of bias because of the notorious "bias blind spot" (130). In many cases we can't rightly dismiss peer disagreement.

In Chapter 6, the phenomenon in question is not the existence of peer disagreement, but the counterfactual possibility of others with objections to our controversial beliefs. Ballantyne calls this the "Problem of Counterfactual Interlocutors." It seems like a historical accident that no interlocutor has presented devastating objections to some of our controversial beliefs. The fact that there could easily have been devastating objections is a prima facie defeater. Absent a defeater-defeater, we should be less confident in those beliefs. But, says Ballantyne, many of the most tempting defeater-defeaters won't have sufficient defeating power. For example, the counterfactual possibility of responses to hypothetical objections isn't sufficient to defeat those hypothetical objections, since in such cases, we'd be left in a position of reasonable uncertainty about which was correct.

In Chapter 7, the defeating phenomenon is not counterfactual (thus, non-existent) objections, but counterevidence that we have reason to believe exists but which we haven't explored yet. This is the "Problem of Unpossessed Evidence." Controversial issues usually have lots of evidence on both sides. Unless we are serious experts on the subject, it is likely that there is counterevidence that we would not be able to satisfactorily dismiss. Knowing this, barring some defeater, we should reduce confidence. In many cases, no defeater-defeater will be on offer. For example, though sometimes we have specific evidence to think that the source of some unpossessed evidence -- say, tobacco-company funded research on the addictiveness of nicotine -- is unreliable, we often don't have that kind of evidence.

The defeating phenomenon in Chapter 8 is the possibility that, in holding some controversial belief, we are engaging in "epistemic trespassing," the tendency to take stands in domains of inquiry where we "lack either the relevant evidence or the skills to interpret the evidence well." (197) If our belief could easily be about such an area then, barring a defeater, we should reduce confidence in the belief (since our evidence could easily be insufficient or poorly evaluated). This is the "Problem of Epistemic Trespassing." As with the previous problems, defeater-defeaters are not easy to come by. For example, we won't often have independent reason to think that those who have appropriate expertise in the domain will end up taking our side on the controversial issue.

Finally, in Chapter 9, Ballantyne details the "Problem of Conflicting Expert Testimony." Many of our controversial beliefs run up against experts who disagree with each other. Unless we have some special reason to think that the experts who agree with us are right, we should reduce confidence. But we often lack such defeater-defeaters because it is "fairly easy" (234) for us amateurs to acquire evidence that we aren't reliable judges of whether one side of the conflicting experts is more reliable than the other.

Ballantyne, in all these cases, has identified genuine problems. It is a thorough and convincing defense of intellectual modesty in response to the perils of our current age. Though popularized discussions of echo chambers, polarization, and cognitive biases seem to take for granted that the right response is the reduction of confidence, Ballantyne identifies and motivates the principled grounding for that recommendation. Anyone who hopes to remain comfortable with their strong controversial beliefs must reckon with the powerful challenges Ballantyne sets forth.

I hope to remain comfortable with my strong controversial beliefs. My primary concern is with premise P2 -- the claim that we often have no defeater for the defeaters Ballantyne identifies. Ballantyne may focus too much on one kind of defeater. We can distinguish between targeted and holistic defeaters. You have a targeted defeater for some objection to your strong belief when you are able to expose a specific way that the objection fails. You have a holistic defeater when, though you may not be able to expose a specific way that the objection fails, your total evidence favors continued strong belief despite your awareness of the objection (see, for example, Lehrer 2000, 135).

To illustrate: suppose your belief that 2≠1 is exposed to a trick "proof" that 2=1. The trick "proof" is a prima facie defeater for your belief that 2≠1. You have a targeted defeater-defeater if you expose a specific error in the "proof" -- say, a division-by-zero error in the final step. But even if you can't expose the error -- you just can't see what's wrong with it -- you have a holistic defeater-defeater as long as your total evidence makes it reasonable to believe that there must be something wrong with the proof; after all, despite the "proof," 2≠1.

Ballantyne is convincing, in every chapter, that when it comes to many of the defeaters he considers, we usually lack targeted defeater-defeaters. We often aren't reasonable in believing that someone who disagrees with us is more biased than we are, or that information sources we haven't yet accessed have been illegitimately funded by interested parties. I'm less sure that Ballantyne has sufficiently excluded the possibility that, in many of his problem cases, we don't have holistic defeater-defeaters.

Does the method show that we should be less confident that there is anthropogenic climate change, that sexual orientation is morally neutral, that there was a single gunman responsible for the assassination of JFK, or that God exists (or doesn't)? Perhaps we lack targeted defeaters for objections against these positions (perhaps we're not experts); iconoclastic scientists, philosophers, and conspiracy theorists can be smart, tricky, and able sophists, after all. But whether we lack holistic defeaters depends on what our total evidence is. This can only be decided on a case by case basis, and it's not an issue that Ballantyne spends much time on.

Holistic defenses are fundamentally Moorean. They amount to the claim that the controversial belief is more plausible, given the total evidence, than the claim of defeat. Ballantyne expresses sympathy to Mooreanism when he responds in Chapter 10 to the charge that the method is self-defeating. After listing six replies to this objection, he argues, "in Moorean fashion" (261) that it is more plausible that the disjunction of the six replies is correct than that the Self-Defeat Objection is correct. So Ballantyne does not seem averse to Moorean defenses in principle.

And Ballantyne does discuss defeater-defeaters that seem Moorean. For example, he seems to agree with Peter Van Inwagen that we can defeat the disagreement of members of the Flat Earth Society by invoking the fact that the total evidence rationally compels belief that the earth is spherical. (126) Presumably, Ballantyne would allow this sort of defeater even if we can't expose specific errors in Flat Earth arguments (they might be very smart sophists). If so, then Ballantyne allows for holistic defeaters.

But Ballantyne goes on to say that "it's doubtful that we can debunk our peers using [this strategy] in many cases of controversy" (126) and that "in most of the disagreements we care about we won't have reason to think our evidence is so potent." (127) I am more optimistic. Ballantyne's conclusion is supposed to be "revisionary," (270) which means that his method needs to show that there are beliefs that we currently hold strongly and think we should hold strongly, but which the method would require us to weaken. This would require evaluation of the total evidence in those cases and an argument that it doesn't provide a holistic defeater-defeater. Lacking that, I remain comfortable in the strong controversial beliefs I started with -- the controversial beliefs I knew to be true.


Chisholm, Roderick (1989). Theory of Knowledge. Englewood Cliffs, NJ, Prentice-Hall, Inc.

Lehrer, Keith (2000). Theory of Knowledge. Boulder, CO, Westview Press.