Knowing Right from Wrong

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Kieran Setiya, Knowing Right from Wrong, Oxford University Press, 2013, 173pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199657452.

Reviewed by Charlie Kurth, Washington University in St. Louis


Kieran Setiya's book offers an important and timely discussion of central issues in moral epistemology. More specifically, it aims to silence three skeptical challenges that build from concerns about moral disagreement (Chapter 1), the reliability of our moral belief forming mechanisms (Chapter 2), and the possibility that we might come to have true moral beliefs completely by accident (Chapters 3-4). Setiya's response to these challenges is sophisticated and nuanced: he identifies what the structure of justification and the nature of ethics must be like if these skeptical concerns are to be refuted, and he builds a case that justification and ethics are actually like this. The result is a rich and interesting defense of moral knowledge and justification. In what follows, I review the central arguments of each chapter, closing with some questions about them.

Chapter 1 explores the prospects for ethical skepticism grounded in facts about disagreement. The general worry is that fundamental moral disagreement with an epistemic equal effectively undermines any claim to be justified. Pressing deeper, Setiya maintains that a version of this worry undermines certain prominent moral epistemologies -- in particular, accounts that give priority to coherence as a source of justification (e.g., the intuitionism of Kagan 2001 and the reflective equilibrium proposals in Brink 1989, Rawls 1971, and elsewhere). Here Setiya puts an interesting spin on a familiar concern. According to these proposals, individuals with completely coherent, but false moral beliefs are fully justified. But this means that we can discount their moral views only by presuming -- groundlessly -- that our beliefs are more reliable than theirs. Thus, these coherentist proposals avoid skepticism only at the cost of an implausible epistemic egoism.

Not only is the above argument significant on its own, it helps motivate Setiya's broadly foundationalist alternative -- Reductive Epistemology. We can see Reductive Epistemology as having three elements. First, there is the reductive thesis: the evidence that ultimately supports our ethical beliefs is non-ethical evidence. Second, there is an explanation of how the non-ethical facts can provide support for ethical propositions. In short, the non-ethical facts that count as evidence for ethical propositions do so because they are picked out by the conditionals implicit in supervenience principles of the following sort:

Ethical Supervenience: If an act or agent falls under ethical concept E, it does so in virtue of falling under the non-ethical concept(s) N such that, necessarily, what falls under N falls under E. (10)

In other words, the evidence by which one's ethical belief that x is E is justified is the evidence that x is N, since, necessarily, if x is N, then x is E (49). Finally, there is an elaboration on the epistemic status of the conditionals encoded in Ethical Supervenience (i.e., conditional of the form: if x is N, then x is E ). While justification in ethics requires that there be justification for these conditionals, it does not require either that one be able to cite them, or that they figure in the content of one's beliefs, in order for the claim that x is E to be justified (50). Thus, the emphasis is on propositional, not doxastic, justification (60ff).

There is much in this proposal that merits discussion, some of which I will touch on below. For now, I merely want to highlight two important features.

First, Reductive Epistemology seems able to block disagreement-based skepticism without falling into the epistemic egoism that undermines more coherentist-oriented proposals. This is because justification in ethics is "biased toward the truth" in the sense that the epistemic position of those who are on the right side of a disagreement is stronger than that of those who are not (53). Only the person in the right has moral beliefs that are supported by the evidence. So when she insists that she is right, she does not display an unwarranted egoism -- the truth is on her side.

Second, while there is a sense in which Reductive Epistemology is reductive, there is also a sense in which it is not. As Setiya explains, justification in ethics turns out to be thoroughly internal:

What counts as evidence in ethics is evidence for the facts in virtue of which an ethical proposition is, or would be, true. The conditionals involved in Supervenience thus constrain epistemology . . . [Therefore,] we cannot divorce the justification of ethical belief from the standards of ethics those conditionals encode. We cannot extricate facts about right and wrong, virtue and vice, from facts about the evidence for their truth. (54)

Chapter 2 adds a reliabilist account of belief formation to Reductive Epistemology and explores two skeptical challenges to the reliability of our moral belief forming mechanisms. These challenges are inspired by the work of Hartry Field (1989) and Sharon Street (2006, ms.). The Field-inspired argument targets moral Realists and builds from the following epistemic principle:

Coincidence: If I know that a correlation between the facts of a discourse and my beliefs about those facts would be inexplicable, then I should doubt there is such a correlation. (See 68)

The argument then maintains that when Coincidence is paired with the Realists' claim that ethical facts are independent of the attitudes that we would have upon reflection, we get skepticism -- for the Realists' account of moral facts appears to entail the very kind of inexplicable correlation between moral facts and moral beliefs that Coincidence rejects. In response, Setiya argues that the moral Realists can respond by (i) showing that Coincidence warrants moral skepticism only if one has no other evidence for believing the correlation exists, and (ii) arguing that Realists have the evidence they need: the fact that one has true ethical beliefs provides evidence of one's reliability.

Setiya acknowledges that this move -- namely, using the truth of one's ethical beliefs as grounds for one's reliability -- might seem to beg the question. So he turns to explore this worry by looking at Street's recent articulation of it. According to Street (ms, §9), the Realist who appeals to his true moral beliefs in order to show that they are reliable is making a claim that is no different from -- and no less question-begging than -- someone who claims to have won the lotto simply because she has a lottery ticket. Fleshing this out, Setiya agrees that the Realist would be begging the question were he to claim that his ethical reliability is grounded solely in the truth of his ethical beliefs. But Reductive Epistemology reveals that the evidence that supports our ethical beliefs is non-ethical; and since the truth of our ethical beliefs is ultimately grounded in non-ethical facts, no questions are begged when we appeal to those beliefs in order to explain our reliability (80ff).

Chapter 3 takes up a skeptical argument related to the above Field-inspired coincidence argument. It contends that if one agrees with Street (2006) and others that we have an (evolutionary) account of ethical belief that shows that those beliefs are wholly independent of ethical facts, then -- even if our ethical beliefs were true -- our belief in them would be a complete accident. But if we get our true beliefs by accident, then we cannot claim to know the associated ethical facts. Thus, while the skepticism of Chapter 2 targets moral justification, the argument here focuses on knowledge.

In response, Setiya argues that it is not enough to merely show that our epistemological method is reliable, we need an explanation of why this is so. Moreover, he maintains that we will be able to provide the needed explanation only if there is a constitutive connection between moral facts and our beliefs about them.

Setiya notes that the need for a constitutive connection might seem to favor Constructivist accounts. After all, the distinctive feature of Constructivism is the claim that moral facts are constituted by our judgments about them. But, against this thought, he argues that 'Externalist' (or Realist) proposals like Boyd 1988 and Wedgwood 2007 also posit a constitutive connection between ethical facts and our beliefs about them (though, unlike the Constructivists, these Externalists maintain that the moral facts, not our beliefs about them, have explanatory priority). If this argument is correct, it has the surprising result that metaphysical debates between Externalists and Constructivists are less significant with regard to answering the skeptic than is often supposed.

The chapter ends with Setiya arguing that Constructivism and Externalism (at least in the basic forms that get examined) cannot give a plausible account of moral error. In short, the standard moves that these views make to explain the constitutive connection between ethical facts and our beliefs about them draw a tight connection between (i) being a competent user of moral terms and (ii) being disposed to have correct moral beliefs. But given how tight this connection is, it turns out that if one has the concept of (say) virtue, one's associated beliefs are bound to be reliable. This leads to an implausible result: individuals (or communities) cannot have false moral beliefs.

Chapter 4 continues the investigation of Chapter 3 in two ways. First, it identifies what must be the case if an Externalist or a Constructivist proposal is to be able to make sense of moral error. In short, moral knowledge and fallibility can be reconciled only if human nature is such that we are generally disposed to believe the truth. This allows for moral error since the disposition to believe the truth is a generic claim (rather than a universal or statistical one); so it can be true even if many (or most) of us have false moral beliefs. The second aim of the Chapter is to license a degree of optimism that human nature is actually as it needs to be in order for skepticism to be false. The discussion here is wide-ranging and schematic. But the core idea returns to the Supervenience thesis from Chapter 1: it's not unreasonable to think that human nature could dispose us to believe the moral truths because it disposes us to track their natural bases (148ff).

With this summary of the book's core argument in hand, I close by briefly raising three issues.

(1) Consider the charge from Chapter 1 that coherentist moral epistemologies allow us to rule out the false, but coherent beliefs of others only by endorsing an implausible epistemic egoism. Should Setiya's opponents be worried? Is egoism of this sort really objectionable? Perhaps not. Some (e.g., Gibbard 1990) argue that giving this sort of epistemic deference to oneself is an essential feature of normative life. Others like David Brink (an explicit target of Setiya's argument) would presumably maintain that giving preferential status to one's own beliefs is a reasonable and inevitable consequence of a theory of justification that allows for justified, but systematically false beliefs (1989, 199-200). So it appears that the debate between Setiya and his coherentist opponents is yet to be settled.

(2) In response to Street, Setiya claims (in Chapter 2) that appealing to the truth of our ethical beliefs in order to substantiate our reliability is not question begging since the truth of those beliefs is ultimately grounded in non-ethical facts. However, this reply doesn't seem to do justice to Street's worry. As Setiya notes, non-ethical facts ground ethical ones in virtue of the conditionals encoded in Supervenience, conditionals which themselves must be (propositionally) justified (50). So are they? While Setiya's affirmative response is hard to tease out, the basic idea is this: we begin by cashing propositional justification out in terms of idealized doxastic justification (61-2); we then appeal to the general account of knowledge from Chapters 3-4 to show that doxastic justification of ethical beliefs (including the Supervenience conditionals) is possible. But this defense is unlikely to have the substance that a response to Street seems to require -- the general account of moral knowledge and the optimistic account of human nature on which it relies leaves just too much unexplained.

(3) I close with a more general concern. As we have seen, Setiya identifies what's required in order to rule out skepticism motivated by various types of epistemic luck: there must be a constitutive tie between the epistemic methods we use and their reliability, ethical belief must be biased toward the truth, and human nature must be such that we are disposed to believe what is true. Along the way, we also learn that knowledge and justification in ethics are importantly different from knowledge and justification elsewhere: it is importantly unlike (e.g.) the inductive and explanatory approaches of the sciences (48-9), the a priori methods of mathematics and logic (44-5), and sensory perception (82).

But then what is moral epistemology like? Without an answer -- without a model that can help us understand and legitimize moral epistemology -- there seems to be a Mackie-style epistemic queerness argument in the offing: it seems that moral knowledge and justification operate in ways that are "utterly different from our ordinary ways of knowing everything else" (1977, 38). Setiya seems sensitive to this concern. In Chapter 4, he suggests that an account of our emotional capacities might help explain the tie between moral concepts and their referents, and so help explain how "human beings are by nature reliable in ethics" (143ff). While this idea is provocative, it raises many questions. How, exactly, are our emotional concepts related to our moral concepts and their referents? How do emotions provide us with epistemic access -- moral or otherwise? Why think that emotions are sufficiently reliable? Is a connection between emotional and moral concepts compatible with the robust objectivity that Setiya wants to vindicate (3; c.f., 155)? While Setiya is cautiously optimistic that these questions can be adequately addressed, others may be more pessimistic.

There is much in Knowing Right from Wrong that merits discussion. It is a rich and provocative contribution to moral epistemology and to ethical theory more generally -- one that is well worth reading. But the book is not for novices. It presumes a substantive understanding of, for instance, the epistemic peer disagreement debate, the evolutionary debunking literature, and discussions of non-accidental knowledge. Thus, the book will be most interesting for specialists, though the issues and the general line of argument are sufficiently clear to be fairly accessible to those who are not.


Thanks to Eric Brown, Eric Wiland, and Kieran Setiya for helpful comments on an earlier version of this review.


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----. Unpublished manuscript. "Objectivity and Truth: You'd Better Rethink It."

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