Knowing the Natural Law: From Precepts and Inclinations to Deriving Oughts

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Steven J. Jensen, Knowing the Natural Law: From Precepts and Inclinations to Deriving Oughts, Catholic University of America Press, 2015, 238pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780813227337.

Reviewed by Anthony J. Lisska, Denison University


Over a quarter of a century ago, Martin Golding -- possibly one of the first American analytic philosophers to take natural law theory seriously -- wrote that one of the more surprising events in moral and legal philosophy was the resurgence of natural law theory. Of course, Elizabeth Anscombe's essay in Philosophy (1958) "Modern Moral Philosophy" did some of the spadework necessary to get natural law theory to float once again in the canals of secular academe. Natural law theory did hold a dominant place in many Roman Catholic seminaries and colleges, but this firm hold was mostly uncritical and often not attuned to contemporary moral and legal problems. In the legal arena, H. L. A. Hart and Lon Fuller, theoretically stung by the Nazi war atrocities and hence the Nuremberg Trial talk about "Crimes against humanity," did their fair share to consider a moral foundation for legal theory beyond the legal positivist dictum from Justinian that "what pleases the prince has the force of law!" The naturalistic fallacy certainly contributed to the nearly comatose reception of any form of natural law theory, which often was seen as nothing more than concept bungling ethical naturalism. All of these factors and their overcoming in the late twentieth century offer a backdrop for the publication of Steven J. Jensen's admirable treatment of Thomas Aquinas's view of natural law as expressed principally in Summa Theologiae I-II, Q. 94, a. 2.

Once natural law theory got its feet through the door of analytic moral and legal theory, differing positions began to be articulated regarding how one principal proponent of natural law theory, Aquinas, had developed his account. In a general schema, one might argue that there are two primary divisions regarding the theoretical analysis of Aquinas on natural law: (A) a theological position and (B) a more philosophical position. The latter division is then divided into (B-i) a foundation requiring a metaphysical position serving as a philosophical anthropology, and (B-ii), a non-ontologically grounded position. Position (A), held by philosophers Steven Long, Fulvio Di Blasi, and Giuseppe Butera among others, argues that God serves as the original foundation stone for natural law theory in Aquinas. Hence, natural law moral theory reduces to a form of theological definism. Position (B-ii) would be exemplified in the original writings of Germain Grisez and his followers, John Finnis, Robert George, Joseph Boyle, and Patrick Lee, among others. This is often referred to as The New Natural Law Theory. Position (B-ii) would be espoused by philosophers normally working through the academic lenses of Grisez's early essay on the foundation of moral theory independent of any theological foundation while accepting the full force of the naturalistic fallacy. Position (B-i) is found in writings principally by those philosophers who suspect that an ethical naturalism position can be found in Aquinas. Among these would be Ralph McInerny, Henry Veatch, Alasdair MacIntyre, and Aristotelian philosopher Martha Nussbaum, among others. Jensen's book would fit, I submit, in the rubric area between Position (B-i) and (B-ii) although there are signs that Jensen in the end leans towards Position (A).

In considering Jensen's analysis, one comes to the judgment that in effect this is a neo-scholastic treatment of Aquinas on natural law along with a massaging of the theory with analytic philosophers Anscombe, Geach, and Foot among others, and also several theologians, Martin Rhonheimer in particular. Yet an important foil for Jensen is Grisez's New Natural Law Theory. Jensen argues correctly that the Grisez/Finnis account renders the practical intellect as paramount in the analysis. Grisez/Finnis argue that the per se nota goods are known through the practical reason. John Haldane once argued that this position is ultimately reducible to a form of intuitionism. Jensen quotes Patrick Lee who argues that for Thomas, the basic goods are "known immediately by reason." (87) Grisez/Finnis want to remove any semblance of a philosophical anthropology from an account of Aquinas on natural law. Jensen, to the contrary, argues correctly that Aquinas uses speculative reason in order to understand what human nature might be; this would be, I suggest, an account of an ontological theory of natural kinds serving as the basis for a "metaphysics of morals." Practical reason then uses the acquired knowledge of human nature in order to determine the first principles for a normative theory of ethics. Thus, in opposition to Grisez/Finnis, human nature as the basis for a philosophical anthropology is a necessary condition for developing a normative theory of ethics.

In articulating his account of human nature, Jensen discusses the three-fold division of per se nota principles for natural law -- what one might call the living, sensitive and rational properties that determine the content of the natural kind. These are the properties that Aquinas, following Book One of Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics, appropriates in the classical cannon for natural law, Summa Theologiae, I-II, Q. 94, a. 2. One might quibble over the translation of "inclinatio." I prefer "dispositional property" rather than "inclination," which eliminates any shadow of Freudian inclination hovering over Aquinas's analysis. Borrowing from Nussbaum's suggestions on Aristotle's account of human nature, one might also use "capability" for "inclinatio". However one might render "inclinatio" into philosophical English, nonetheless Jensen is on the right track arguing that this ontological foundation, in opposition to Grisez/Finnis, is a necessary condition for developing a fulsome account of Aquinas on natural law.

One interpretative query I have regarding Jensen's analysis is on the end of human actions. There are several aspects to this analysis. Is there one end to which all human actions are directed, or are there many? In other words, are the ends incommensurate or are they commensurate? Jensen argues for the latter by suggesting that every moral action must be directed towards a human's final goal, which is union with God in the afterlife. This is the end of Aristotelian eudaimonia as rendered into Aquinas's medieval theory of natural law. One might argue, to the contrary, that there are incommensurate goals to which human actions are directed. This position suggests that the end of human actions -- eudaimonia -- might be rendered into English as "self-actualization." In this way, what Aquinas calls "felicitas" is the attainment of some form of Aristotelian eudaimonia. This is attained by the "actuality" of the "dispositional properties" making up the content of human nature. Aquinas himself refers to what he calls "imperfect happiness" and "perfect happiness." Imperfect happiness is what is attained in this earthly trek, while perfect happiness is attained only when the human psyche comes in direct contact with the Godhead in the afterlife. McInerny in offering an analysis of this distinction notes that both Aquinas and Aristotle refer to imperfect happiness as episodic; hence imperfect happiness cannot be equated with perfect happiness in the afterlife. Nonetheless this state of actualization is in some way attainable in this life. While there is some debate in neo-scholastic circles over this account, nonetheless this distinction renders possible a normative ethic on philosophical grounds and renders plausible a form of ethical naturalism for interpreting Aquinas's moral theory.

One might ask how this role for God (Position (A)), fits into a rational ethic. On this query, it always appeared to me that getting God into the system is merging theology with philosophy -- a distinction that Aquinas kept distinct as much as he could. Following the insights of Gilson and Copleston -- and Victor White along with Brian Davies -- what the human mind can know about God is limited to the ground of existence -- Tillich's "ground of being." This would be the conclusion of Aquinas's Third Way (the Tertia Via). How this "Esse per se Subsisens" can provide normative principles for leading a moral life is puzzling at best and muddled at worst. One might argue that this is where the magisterium of the Roman Church enters the fray, but this is hardly a philosophical response. In these discussions, we must not forget Heidegger's quip that one does not bend the knee to the first cause. Jensen does argue that the ultimate end is God; here, in my judgment, Jensen jumps from a philosophical analysis to theological principles. Of course, he is not alone here.

Throughout his analysis, Jensen appears to reject an account of ethical naturalism in Aquinas. He refers to this as descriptivism. It would appear that this rules out a priori the analysis of Veatch, MacIntyre, McInerny, and others working on these issues in Aquinas.

One reservation I have about Jensen's analysis is his account of the end of human sexuality. He provides the well-worn argument that we can determine unequivocally the end of sexuality almost by examining the physiology of the sex organs and somehow deriving a purpose and end. Nearly a half-century ago, the English Dominican, Columba Ryan, posed some serious reservations about this procedure, arguing that a human person is not simply a complex of organs. Ryan suggests that what is natural for human persons is achieving proper human fulfillment, which in turn is rooted in the human ability to be in communication with others at a human level. Finnis too argues for a more inclusive view of human sexuality within marriage. In his Aquinas, he notes that Aquinas argued for marriage as a form of human friendship and avoided reducing sexuality to its mere biological dimensions. Finnis even suggests that some Latin terms were replaced in later editions of the Summa Theologiae that place more emphasis on the biological dimension. Ryan and Finnis offer, it appears, a more sophisticated reading of Aquinas on these important matters.

Lest one think that I am critical of this analysis in toto, let it be said that Jensen's analysis of what we might call "Aquinas's action theory" is very good. Action theory in Aquinas is a tough philosophical chestnut to crack. Alan Donagan and Finnis have done commendable jobs on this set of issues. Jensen's analysis is first rate. He considers how the human will moves from the information on human nature attained through the speculative intellect to the eventual undertaking of an action. There are three parts to the will's "movement" that Jensen suggests: the materially practical, the virtually practical, and the fully practical knowledge. Philosophers often overlook the action of the will in Aquinas because of its many steps and its difficulty in trying to tell the story. This is a strength in Jensen's book, to be sure.

A final set of observations. In some ways, this book struck this reviewer as an example of what McInerny and others once called "River Forest Thomism." This would be an attempt to render the texts and positions of Aquinas into modern discussions. A defensive posture, however, was always a keynote tendency. This philosophical method reminds us how G. R. Evans once described the major difference between Bernard of Clairvaux and Peter Abelard. Clairvaux always wanted to keep the boat of theological positions inside the safety of the harbor. Abelard wanted to push the boat beyond the breakers out into the open sea. Clairvaux thought it far more important not to rock the boat than to push the boat a little farther out to sea. It would seem that there are many issues in ethical naturalism that Veatch, MacIntyre and McInerny garnered from the texts of Aquinas that require more analysis and discussion. Hence some moral philosophers would like to see more of an Abelard approach to these important texts of ethical naturalism in discussions with a broader philosophical cohort. If you want to find a good "River Forest Thomist" analysis of Aquinas on natural law, then Jensen's book can be warmly recommended. If you want a broader approach to Aquinas's marvelous moral theory, then this analysis has some tenuous limits.