Knowledge and Ideology: The Epistemology of Social and Political Critique

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Michael Morris, Knowledge and Ideology: The Epistemology of Social and Political Critique, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 302 pp., $105.00, ISBN 9781107177093.

Reviewed by Maeve Cooke, University College Dublin


This book seeks to disentangle the complex, often conflicting lines of thinking that now constitute the concept of ideology critique since its origins in the work of Karl Marx. Taking his lead from Terry Eagleton's 1994 introductory study, Morris distinguishes between epistemic conceptions of ideology, on the one side, and functional conceptions, on the other. For social critics on the first side, ideology is illusion; for those on the second, it is the oppressive intellectual armoury of a social class. The first tradition, in its stronger versions, views knowledge as inherently constituted by the social interests or positions of knowers; the second, which has gained ascendance, tends to bracket the cognitive properties of beliefs and theories. Diverging from Eagleton, who attributes to Marx an equivocation between the two conceptions, Morris defends Marx, in whose work he discerns strong cognitive commitments which, if revived appropriately, could counter the dangerous forms of "skepticism, political indifference, doxastic apathy, cynicism, nihilism, and violence" generated by the largely non-Marxist, functional tradition of ideology critique (4). The most promising direction for rehabilitating the cognitive line of thinking about ideology critique, in his view, is a neo-Hegelian form of Marxism.

The bulk of the book is devoted to historical discussions of a range of German and French thinkers who have embraced various functional versions of ideology critique. They include Foucault, Nietzsche, Althusser, Stirner, and Sorel, but also less widely-read writers such as Ernst Jünger and Hanns Johst. Morris' critical engagement with these thinkers is intended not only to illustrate an independent systematic argument but, in addition, to constitute an essential step in the development of his project. For, true to his Hegelian leanings, Morris contends that there is much to learn from these thinkers. While he ultimately favours a stance diverging from their non-cognitive and sceptical positions, on a general level he endorses their rejection of traditional epistemology on grounds of its increasing implausibility and irrelevance, and agrees that this has dramatic social consequences.

In the first chapter, Morris analytically distinguishes two perspectives on beliefs, theories, and other cognitive entities. One perspective focuses on their cognitive status, on their attempts to represent, reflect, or otherwise capture the world as it is, seeing them as -- possibly incorrect -- explanations of the same world; the other treats them as part of the reality to be explained, as entities in the world. This sets the scene for his analytic distinction between the epistemic and functional conceptions of ideology critique and for his criticisms of functional conceptions.

To begin with, he pursues a familiar line of argument. He claims that functional ideology critiques self-destruct due to their rejection of genuine knowledge and normativity. To be sure, they make a valuable contribution to social criticism in several ways. Their unmasking, debunking, and deconstruction reminds us of the need for epistemic humility and they often speak on behalf of social groups in positions of lesser power. However, their approach to social criticism is inherently flawed, since they undermine the normative basis for liberational politics and the intrinsic value of public enlightenment. By presenting the world as the interminable clash of power against power, they dispense with the normative resources they would need in order to unmask power as oppressive, to champion and bolster the loci of lesser power, or to create a world of diffuse and localized power. Such aspirations are reduced to mere preferences, which threaten to become dulled, desperate, and thankless with the fading of the once widespread perception that the strong normative commitments of political thinking and practice are rationally justified. In short, the functional critique of ideology is logically incoherent, appealing to ethical or rational standards it itself calls into question. To be sure (this is my interjection), the accusation of logical incoherence cannot seriously disturb proponents of functional ideology critique, since they also call into question the very notion of logical argument.

Morris pursues a second line of attack that I see as more promising. He argues that the functional critique of ideology frequently leads to a troubling glorification of violence. If the will to power grounds and exhausts human reality, then we face a choice regarding our preferred modalities of power:

If we are weak, timid, cautious, and small-minded, we might prefer non-violent, stable, and collectively binding forms of power  . . .  Alternatively, if we are bold and filled with strength; if we are particularly adverse to dishonesty and hypocrisy; if we suffer the agony of socially manufactured shame and guilt; or if we long for adventure, novelty, and creation, then we might celebrate more violent, explosive, and direct forms of conflict. (96)

This is a particularly interesting part of the book. Morris does not confine his discussions to the more obvious champions of violence such as Nietzsche or Sorel; in addition, he argues convincingly that writers such as Rousseau (in the "Second Discourse") and Sartre (in his "Preface" to Fanon's The Wretched of the Earth) advocate violence as the more honest response to socially produced evils; while violence for Rousseau still has some kind of moral quality, increasingly it becomes an aesthetic preference, celebrated for its creativity and authenticity.

Morris offers an extensive reading of Max Stirner in his relationship with Marx as a basis for a further thesis: Stirner and, after him, Sorel, Jünger and others, appropriate and distort socialist terminology for violent, transgressive, and bohemian ends. He argues, furthermore, that this appropriation expresses the violent self-loathing of the bourgeoisie: an obsessive and consuming self-loathing that leaves no room for attention to the real suffering of the social classes on which bourgeois wealth and privilege depends; this -- largely unacknowledged -- self-loathing is a consequence of the dominant capitalist model of selfhood, which encourages us to see every facet of our social existence in purely instrumental terms.

By demonstrating their unsavoury exaltation of violence, abuse of socialist theory, and tendency to neglect real social suffering, Morris effectively shows the need to move beyond functional critiques of ideology. Indeed, he unmasks its proponents as glorifiers of violence, opportunists and, quite often, self-absorbed bourgeois aesthetes.

This book makes an important contribution to contemporary discussions of knowledge and power and, more generally, to critical social theorizing in its manifold variations. The density and complexity of its subject matter do not always make for easy reading, but there is a great deal of, mostly helpful, repetition. Moreover, the book is enlivened by intriguing discussions of figures such as Stirner, Jünger and Johst, who do not often feature in treatments of ideology, as well as by its unusual perspective on Rousseau. It may be commended, in particular, for avoiding the tedious sparring between Nietzschean-Foucauldians and Kantian-Habermasians that has been characteristic of encounters between the two parties for the past 50 years. As mentioned, Morris does not dwell on the logical incoherence of functional critiques, to which they are largely impervious; instead, he exposes features that many (on both sides) are likely to find repellent: their celebration of violence, their opportunism, their bourgeois self-absorbedness and their disregard for real social suffering. By doing so, he calls on proponents of functional critiques either to adopt an affirmative stance to what others may regard as repellent qualities or to acknowledge the need to move beyond a purely functional position. He thus opens up a path for both sides of the divide to rethink the meaning of normativity in a world in which certain modalities of rational judgment and discourse have been irrevocably discredited. Commendably, Morris himself embarks on this path. The final part of the book articulates the details of his proposed neo-Hegelian variation of epistemic ideology critique.

It starts by discussing Marx's critical engagement with German Idealism. From there it considers Mannheim's sociology of knowledge, which Morris sees as a productive development of Marx's distinctive epistemological insights. Mannheim reveals the inherently interested and socially located nature of broad domains of human thought, while at the same time alerting us to the dire consequences that follow from the total collapse of rational inquiry and discourse. Cognition, for Mannheim, is inherently and rightly interested. Marshalling support from Habermas' theory of knowledge and human interests, Morris addresses the two most frequent lines of criticism against Mannheim: his apparently illicit attempt to derive normativity from the purely descriptive science of sociology and the worry that the interested nature of rational inquiry undermines its claims to adjudicate between competing interests and to guide our actions in the right direction. However, Morris finds Habermas' approach limited in key respects and offers, instead, a neo-Hegelian reading of Mannheim, supplemented by Lukács. The neo-Hegelian strategy he advocates presupposes a realist social ontology grounded in human practices and views the interested nature of social cognition as reflecting the inherently interested nature of social reality itself. All thought is interested, but it may be criticized as ideological when it assumes sublimated or distorted forms (by "sublimation" he means abstraction, in the sense of a reified projection). But -- this is the distinctively Hegelian move -- ideological critiques of sublimated or distorted forms of consciousness are necessary steps in the attainment of social knowledge, understood as a hermeneutic movement towards a more adequate, articulate, revised conception of totality -- as a cognitive progression (182, 271).

Thus, Morris moves beyond neo-Kantian transcendental approaches to the constitution of knowledge in order to propose a neo-Hegelian social ontology as the basis for a corresponding conception of epistemic ideology critique. In contrast to neo-Kantians, for whom the object of knowledge first receives its structure from our mental activity, his neo-Hegelian social ontology holds that social reality receives its structure through the practical activities from which our knowledge-constituting aims emerge: The object of knowledge is the actual object formed by our practical activity. This alternative social ontology rests on five fundamental principles. First, in an Aristotelian vein, the ends of human activity are not external to human practices, but emerge through them. Second, social objects must always be conceived of in terms of the formative activities that generate and continually transform them. Third, the process of object formation is simultaneously a process of the constitution of human consciousness or subjectivity. Fourth, the formation of individual objects and subjectivities takes place within more complex and larger processes, which must be conceived of as a totality that it is extremely difficult to comprehend. Fifth, agency is best conceived of in collective terms in relation to the inherently collective processes that constitute it. This social ontology meshes with an account of ideology critique as critical reflection on theoretical accounts of socially inherited, habituated practices, which are triggered by some practical conflict or frustration. Such critical reflection is necessary because our formation as knowers is always by way of practices that are complex, ambivalent, limited, and partial, and because theories have a built-in tendency towards sublimation. In consequence, our attempts at theorizing tend to generate distortions, simultaneously revealing and concealing the social reality on which they reflect.

Furthermore, practices have a history together with a promissory dimension; any account of how things are presupposes an understanding of how things were and a sense of how they plausibly might become; thus, theories of social reality are not just a matter of simple observation, but also involve interpretation and normative assumptions (the same holds, of course, for ideological critique of theories of social reality). In consequence, no theory can ever show the world as it really is. This means that ideology is not a form of bad faith or self-deception, but the inevitable result of even the most honest and careful attempts to see the reality of the social world. Presumably, the same holds for every critique of ideological theory. Nonetheless, taking as its model Freudian psychoanalysis, ideology critique can aspire to identify sublimating theoretical distortions and to uncover "the more humiliated, heteronymous, and thwarted features and episodes in the history of a practice" (290).

With some effort on my part at comprehension, Morris took me with him on his journey to this conclusion. What I wanted to know as I read the last line, however, is where the proposed conception of the relationship between thought and social reality leaves us with regard to relativism. The introductory chapter suggests that he sees relativism as a problem and seeks to provide some answer, albeit provisional (21-22). Moreover, as we saw, he applauds Mannheim's insistence on the need for rightly interested cognition, for a conception of reason that can "guide and adjudicate" (277). To this end, in his introductory remarks, he proposes the tentative pursuit of "the Hegelian universal", understood as the singular and total pattern that emerges from our interrelated particularities (22). The final chapter helps us to understand what is meant by this pattern. But why should we have confidence that the patterns emerging in the process of history constitute a cognitive progression, that they are normatively better, in a truth-related sense, than the patterns they supersede? Morris (rightly) dispenses with the metaphysical and theological guarantees provided by Hegel. But without them, as he acknowledges, the existence of any kind of Hegelian universal remains dubious. The difficulty, as I see it, is not that this makes ideology critique "a tentative, fragile, and potentially limited enterprise" (22). I share his view that the provisional, insecure, and partial nature of ideology critique is not a deficiency; indeed, I would say, in a world in which traditional conceptions of reason have been largely discredited, it is an argument for engaging in it. The problem, rather, is that absent the metaphysical and theological components, the Hegelian vision of social change for the better, even the sense that social practices may have an liberational promissory note, is called into question. In other words, how, post-Hegel, may we speak of reason as guiding and adjudicating, and how robust is the epistemic dimension of Morris' proposed version of ideology critique?