Knowledge and Ignorance of Self in Platonic Philosophy

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James M. Ambury and Andy German (eds.), Knowledge and Ignorance of Self in Platonic Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 274pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107184466.

Reviewed by Christopher Moore, Penn State University


The problem of self-knowledge is a reasonable candidate for the core problem of philosophy. It serves as a good nexus for epistemology, metaphysics, and ethics and for approaches from all corners of the discipline. It keeps the inquiry somewhat below the heavens. And it makes sense of Socrates as an exemplary figure, one who strives, with analytic acuity, to undermine conceits and doctrinal self-confidence. The as-yet-unresolved difficulties constituting the problem of self-knowledge fall into at least two overlapping historical groups. There are those programmatic in contemporary epistemology, connected to warrant for first-person knowledge of occurrent mental states. These include matters of evidence, justification, and specification of the knowable mental states: the general question is, given the differences between apprehending facts in the outer and the mental worlds, how can both kinds of fact-apprehension count as knowledge?

The other difficulties are those best known from ancient Greek philosophy, connected to the kind of thing the self must be to stand both as a subject and object of knowledge. These include whatever limits on reflexivity there may be; the nature of selfhood and its relation to psuchê, desires, reason, and individuality; and the degree to which “knowing oneself” really amounts to coming to be able to know (anything) and coming to be a self (rather than jumble of instincts, impressions, and reactions). The general question here is, given the range of things one could strive to know — e.g., human norms, the will of the gods, cosmic patterns — what makes striving to know oneself both possible and beneficial? Plato’s dialogues reflect a lifetime of his and Socrates’ explicit and productive attention to these latter problems of self-knowledge. But if self-knowledge were a core problem in (ancient) philosophy, we might expect more scholarship directed at it — and not just bromides about the gnôthi sauton and the therapeutic effects of the so-called elenchus.

This feeling of a lack motivates the volume edited by James M. Ambury and Andy German. One of the book’s strengths is that it shows issues of self-knowledge to suffuse Plato’s works, emphasizing Alcibiades, Apology, Charmides, Phaedrus, Republic, Symposium, Theaetetus, and Theages, and giving some attention to Laws, Meno, Parmenides, Philebus, and Sophist. The editors also have the salutary goal of including chapters “from very different interpretative principles.” A weakness of the book, however, is that this breadth and openness serves no specifically articulated program of investigation and, as we will see, mostly foregoes dialectical engagement with others in and out of Plato studies concerned about self-knowledge. Too often papers end up being isolated, if edifying, readings of specific dialogues on the theme of knowledge of oneself. I turn to those chapters, with the upshot for self-knowledge, below. First, the title and introduction.

This book’s title, Knowledge and Ignorance of Self in Platonic Philosophy, is neither entirely idiomatic nor entirely apt (the editors really only speak of “self-knowledge” and a bit about “self-ignorance”); but no matter - maybe it’s better for search results. “Platonic” serves rather than “Plato’s” to indicate studies of the dialogues of doubted authenticity and of Proclus, a ("neo")Platonist. I do query the final word, “Philosophy”: why not “Dialogues”? Most chapters explicate dialogues rather than articulate, against or in conversation with other philosophers, for example Heraclitus or Aristotle or Kant, a “Platonic” “philosophy,” as a distinctive program or result of inquiry. There are exceptions, to be sure, and the editors are free to believe that Plato has views that can be recovered. Despite their claim, however, I don’t think the book really aims to “highlight the relevance of Plato’s thought to contemporary debates on selfhood, self-reflection, and subjectivity.”

The introduction is part of the problem. It opens with some high paragraphs about “a certain loss of confidence in modernity’s philosophical conception of . . . ‘selfhood’ as such” and the motivation to return to Plato’s thinking about “our capacity for becoming . . . an object of our own interior reflection . . . without our . . . now-questionable concept of subjectivity.” It soon leaves that (unpromising) theme for a list of some topics in relation to which Plato seems to think about self-knowledge, including the pursuit of desire, psychic structure, the nature of thinking, and the educability of the soul.

But is there really value in thinking specifically about Plato on self-knowledge? I see two related ways to show it. Ambury and German could have shown that Plato’s works clarify, rejigger, even resolve ongoing philosophical problems of, say, self-determination, the discovery of human nature, or the evaluation of one’s commitments. For example: Sartre’s idea that thinking of oneself as a source of action as one thought too many; Moran’s analysis of self-knowledge as determined through investigation rather than discovered through introspection. Or the editors could have shown that existing scholarship on Plato has developed important questions internal to Plato’s work that can be satisfactorily dealt with only by thinking about self-knowledge.

Neither route gets followed here. The introduction almost wholly avoids scholarly engagement: it cites only five works, almost in passing and none by name, as proving a burgeoning industry in the topic. On the first page, the editors write: “Doubtless there has been a sea change in the three decades since Julia Annas’ diagnosis that Plato’s interest in self-knowledge ‘faded’ as he graduated to a more mathematical conception of ἐπιστήμη and its objects.” They mean Annas’ 1985 “Self-Knowledge in Early Plato.” It no longer represents the state of the art; but it is a great chapter in an edited collection, and deserves its frequent citation, for the very reason that it advances a determinate multi-part thesis with which one can engage: what counts as “self-knowledge” (she famously defines it, with Bradley, as knowing “one’s stations and duties”), what role it plays in the arguments of Plato’s dialogues, how it can be identified with justice, and the way other concepts end up playing its role, for good reasons, in certain of Plato’s dialogues. Even though I, for one, would take issue with each part, the paper brilliantly articulates an anxiety I have concerning the limits on the usefulness of the concept of “self-knowledge” in Plato. Disappointingly, Annas’ paper never arises again in this book.

On page 7, Ambury and German cite the other four works. No content is ascribed to Edward Ballard’s Socratic Ignorance: An Essay on Platonic Self-Knowledge (1965), dismissed simply as “outdated” despite having a “masterful command of the topic.” Nor is content ascribed to Charles Griswold’s Self-Knowledge in Plato’s Phaedrus (1986) or Andrea Tschemplik’s Knowledge and Self-Knowledge in Plato’s Theaetetus (2008), both dismissed for concerning only single dialogues: but for the unitarian, so what? Similarly, no content is ascribed to my own Socrates and Self-Knowledge (2015), dismissed as concentrating “exclusively” on Socrates (in Charmides, Alcibiades, Phaedrus, and Philebus), though given the centrality of Socrates to each of this volume’s thirteen chapters, and the way, arguably, Plato develops his views through the conversations of Socrates, I don’t see the problem. Thus the introduction does not provide a dialectical justification for studying Plato on self-knowledge, and does not bring a reader up-to-speed on, or remind a fellow laborer about, the still-urgent topics in the field.

I belabor the editors’ underuse of scholarship because it is symptomatic for the volume. Four chapters have effectively no explicit engagement with others (Lloyd P. Gerson, Drew A. Hyland, Jeremy Bell, Eric Sanday); two others have minimal engagement (Thomas Tuozzo, Sara Ahbel-Rappe); the rest point to parallel discussions by other scholars without engaging concertedly with them. Does this mavericity betray the Socratic-Platonic vision of self-knowledge as adhering to a regimen of reciprocal examination, a recognition of our epistemic feebleness and the godsend in finding others who might teach us something? (There is no index entry for “self-knowledge, and conversation.”)

Onto the chapters now, which follow no editorially specified order.

1. Gerson, “Self-Knowledge and the Good.”  Self-knowledge is the recognition of (= knowledge of and identification with) one’s ideal self, which is one’s reason or intellect, as opposed to some merely apparent self, for example the subject of one’s occurrent desires. Knowing oneself involves making judgments about one’s desires, assessing whether they aim at the actual rather than merely apparent good. Thus self-knowledge, a real achievement, also requires knowledge of the form of the good. “Self-knowledge is the mediating idea between the metaphysics of the Good and the way of life that is philosophy.” Whatever metaphysical commitments coming to know oneself actually requires, this paper enunciates — efficiently, provocatively, and persuasively — the core commitment of Platonic self-knowledge: the self is a normative self, constituted by its rational commitments to the good and the true. Many of the subsequent chapters adopt this view, even if silently or indirectly. Unlike some of the following chapters, however, this one demonstrates that one can talk of Platonic self-knowledge without talk of psuchê (“soul”), which seems often to become a lexical redundancy.

2. Tuozzo, “Two Faces of Platonic Self-Knowledge: Alcibiades I and Charmides.”  Though the Alcibiades focuses on knowledge of self and, by contrast, the Charmides focuses on knowledge of itself, these dialogues end up with compatible and mutually illuminating views of self-knowledge. Tuozzo gives insightful and convincing readings of each dialogue to show this. (A Gersonian shortcut not here taken: if the self is a knowing self, then a person’s knowledge of herself as knower is both a knowledge of oneself and a knowledge of knowledge.) Consistency between two dialogues matters little on its own terms; Tuozzo goes on to claim that both dialogues concern a knowledge that “is strictly speaking good for a human being.” This is an important claim; it seeks an answer to the question posed by Socrates in the Charmides and Alcibiades in the Alcibiades: what value is there in the reflexive or hierarchical state of knowing knowledge? Is it not empty because redundant? This is a question many of the subsequent chapters address, even if (again) silently or indirectly. An answer in the context of these two dialogues should have something to do with sôphrosunê, the virtue of “discipline” that serves as the Charmides’ focal concept and Alcibiades’ argumentative pivot, in both dialogues equated, at least tentatively, with self-knowledge.

3. Hyland, “Socratic Self-Knowledge and the Limits of Epistêmê.”  Self-knowledge is not a mode of epistêmê (“knowledge”); it must be some other epistemic state. This is argued on the basis of the Charmides, with Hyland claiming that the view that self-knowledge as an epistêmê of epistemai (etc.) is shown to be impossible but that “Socratic self-knowledge” — knowing what one knows and does not know — is not. The dialogue does show something unsatisfactory about Critias’ analysis of self-knowledge as a second-order epistêmê on the model of the various fields of knowledge, such as medicine and geometry. But it seems to me that the Socratic inflection, which is merely personalized and treated in terms of the verb eidenai, fares no better in the argument, even if Socrates shows its possibility through his actions. There are other mistaken or misleading statements in this through-reading of the dialogue. It refers to virtually no scholarship other than Hyland’s 1981 book on the Charmides — itself inspirational for the time, uniquely putting the dialogue at the center of philosophical reflection, but one not benefited from the nearly four decades of rigorous and textually sensitive attention to the dialogue since its publication. Hyland does not even acknowledge the existence of Tuozzo’s work in the preceding chapter or his field-changing 2011 study of the dialogue.

4. Ahbel-Rappe, “Socratic Wisdom and Platonic Knowledge in the Dialogues of Plato.”  Self-knowledge is both high wisdom and empty: it is not the knowledge of any object of knowledge — i.e., any mental content — but rather of knowing itself, the “container” or judge of those contents. Comments about the Charmides and a successful description of the latter parts of the Theaetetus advance the two parts of this claim. It is not an easy argument to follow, lacking dialectical engagement with any surrounding chapters. But thematic continuity exists: with Hyland, the knowledge constituting Socrates’ wisdom or self-knowledge differs from the usual sorts of knowledge; with Tuozzo, it is somehow reflexive but not too reflexive; with Gerson, it is an essential feature of one’s conception of oneself as knower.

5. James M. Ambury, “Between Ascent and Descent: Self-Knowledge and Plato’s Allegory of the Cave.”  Each level of the divided line in Republic Book 6 corresponds to a type of self-knowledge. “Eikastic”: I see my shadow as me. “Aporetic”: I see my shadow as a shadow of me, but I do not know what I am. “Dianoetic”: I see myself as once having been confused about myself, and am pleased about my newfound self-understanding. “Intellective”: I know myself in my knowing, a subject and not mere object of knowledge. This chapter also explains why philosophers have to “return to the cave”: full self-knowledge recognizes that one is not purely an intellective being, and so one cannot live solely with intellectual objects. I did not feel particularly assisted in seeing how the four-fold taxonomy maps onto practical life. Would, too, that there had been engagement with the only other recent paper on self-knowledge in the Republic, Mary Margaret McCabe’s “From the Cradle to the Cave: What Happened to Self-Knowledge in the Republic?” (Platonic Conversations, 2015).

6. Brian Marrin, “Self-Knowledge and the Use of the Self in the Platonic Theages.”  Self-knowledge amounts, finally, to knowing what to do with oneself, what final end to pursue. Marrin argues from a thought-experiment about the tyrant who can do anything, unobstacled, but whose freedom makes salient his ignorance about its use, and from the drama of the Theages, which includes Socrates’ famous knowledge of ta erôtika as “his capacity for uncovering for his interlocutors the true nature of their desires.” We have returned yet again to self-knowledge as the clarification of and identification with one’s fundamental desires: the recovery of a (normative) self.

7. Sara Brill, “Between Biography and Biology: Bios and Self-Knowledge in Plato’s Phaedrus.”  We are to know ourselves not just as selves or souls but as end-directed lives, where knowing one’s “life” or “manner of life” includes knowing one’s political context and attitude toward truth. For all its complications, this chapter goes beyond its predecessors in dwelling on self-knowledge’s possible connection with our temporal extension, practical identity, and (thus) teleological narrative dimension. While not responding to the debate about “impersonal” vs. “idiosyncratic” selves ultimately to be known, it rightly asks us to think about the kinds of people we are who attribute to ourselves a “self”: people who live through time in patterned and more or less organized fashions.

8. Bell, “A Toil-Loving Soul.”  The good and self-knowing life is active and awake, principally in thinking about the virtues and oneself. A sententious and sometimes tendentious chapter (I doubt Plato’s predecessors so lauded sleep), it at least resonates with Brill’s paper, cheering lives lived actively. Yet I could not tell whether Bell believes self-knowledge achievable, even if through continuous activity.

9. Andy German, “Mathematical Self-Ignorance and Sophistry: Theodorus and Protagoras.”  Mathematics does not on its own improve one’s understanding of virtue. Paradoxically, in its prizing of clarity, it can seduce one into failing to see its inadequacy. This is a not unfamiliar lesson of the Theaetetus. We return, again, to the necessary normativity of self-knowledge: we must know what is good.

10. Marina McCoy, “Why is Knowledge of Ignorance Good?”  When aporia leads to recognition of one’s limitations, it can encourage the pursuit of knowledge, and it can lead to greater generosity with others. Yet, McCoy claims, pointing to the Meno, recognizing one’s ignorance does not always motivate inquiry. Obscured by much summary of dialogues is a good question: when does it so motivate? McCoy emphasizes the “affective” dimension, though I wonder whether, in conversation with the volume’s other authors, she would accept the language of “discovery (or obfuscation) of one’s deeper desires.”

11. Sanday, “Self-Knowledge in Plato’s Symposium.”  Recognition of limits and the affective recur here: “Through eros, human beings exceed the limit that defines them, and at the same time they become aware of being subject to that limit and learn to attend to it properly.” Because of erôs, talk of beauty may be called for: “Self-knowledge, or virtue simply, would consist of a life of sustained and appreciative letting-presence of the beautiful.” This is an edifying and provocative idea, bringing “beauty” onto the self-knowledge scene, even if Sanday does not connect it up with the concerns of his volume-companions. Yet the connections ought to be drawn out, since he believes, with nearly all of them, that “the question of self-knowledge is whether we are choosing our lives in light of ultimate reasons or causes, and thereby, living seriously.”

12. Danielle A. Layne, “Double Ignorance and the Perversion of Self-Knowledge.”  “Double ignorance,” by contrast with “recognized ignorance,” is failing to know what you fail to know, and this is a grave political danger. More intriguingly, the failure of love (of oneself and others) causes (and is caused by?) the failure of knowledge (of oneself and others).

13. Harold Tarrant, “Philebus, Laws, and Self-Ignorance”  Plato’s concerns about self-knowledge changed across his career. The Philebus focuses only on self-ignorance; in the late dialogues generally “there is no real interest . . . in self-knowledge as a key to any of the virtues.” Earlier dialogues treat self-knowledge as “a deep awareness of the very core of our being or . . . the foundations for virtue.” Tarrant reasons at least from the Phaedrus, though the previous twelve chapters (etc.) give cause to qualify the contrast. Tarrant draws this distinction less to explicate any particular view than to show that the Alcibiades, as a “deeper truths” dialogue, would not be written late in Plato’s career (as Nicholas Denyer, in an influential commentary, has argued). He makes a similar claim about Alcibiades II.

Here I conclude. Despite all the editors’ talk of diverse approaches and the contributors’ ignorance of each other’s work, the chapters generally share important commitments: we should consider the self to be normative; distinguish the “object” of self-knowledge from that of other kinds of knowledge; treat humans as ideal epistemic agents and practical agents; foreground the concept of “one’s life”; and meditate on love and beauty.

A final and dour observation about the book’s production. The end matter has terribly many fundamental errors, indicating no editorial oversight. The main text should also have received (more) rigorous proofreading, with more than two dozen mistakes, often in the spelling of Greek words. The unprincipled toggling between Greek font and transliteration distracts.