Knowledge and its Place in Nature

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Kornblith, Hilary, Knowledge and its Place in Nature, Oxford, 2003, 177pp, $ 29.95 (hbk), ISBN 0199246319.

Reviewed by Paul A. Roth, University of Missouri, St. Louis


We seek to represent the world. When our representations succeed in a particularly fortuitous manner, we term the result ’knowledge.’ But questions then arise: which representation qualify as knowledge, and why? One of the divers epistemological theories lately bruited about would assimilate all empirical knowledge—representations of the world properly obtained—to results certified by the various sciences (liberally understood). Call this doctrine ’naturalism.’

Yet mention naturalism, and many philosophers smirk. The reason? Too vague and underspecified, or so some epistemologists claim. This places a special burden on those seeking to advance the cause of naturalism (I include myself here) to clarify naturalism’s relation to more conventional forms of philosophizing. In this regard, Hilary Kornblith’s Knowledge and its Place in Nature both succeeds and fails. Success occurs in those chapters where Kornblith directly addresses and defends naturalism against two prime forms of mystery-mongering rampant in philosophy—invoking intuitions and sacralizing norms. However, and more importantly, Kornblith ultimately fails to advance the case for naturalism. For he attempts to link his variant of naturalism—a decidedly anti-metaphysical doctrine as usually understood — to a deeply problematic claim that knowledge constitutes a “natural kind”—a stubbornly metaphysical doctrine as usually understood. The result disappoints.

The book has six chapters. Chapters 1, 5, and 6 explore the meta-theme of how Kornblith conceives of naturalism’s relation to more traditional conceptions of philosophy. Chapter 1 contrasts appeals to intuition and naturalism as methodological arbiters of philosophical practice. Kornblith examines arguments by George Bealer to the effect that if naturalists have no room for appeal to intuition, then so much the worse for naturalism. Bealer and others charge that naturalism must be ruled out as a philosophy because it cannot accommodate what is, in point of fact, standard operating procedure for philosophers. Although Nelson Goodman’s name appears nowhere in the text and Kornblith cites no works of his, Kornblith’s defense here has the appropriate Goodmanian flavor, viz., that “Recognition of appropriate inferential patterns is an empirical affair for the naturalist” (22). Kornblith effectively rebuts the various cavils against naturalism raised by friends of intuitions. He rightly, I would say, identifies philosophy as more a particular set of questions, and not as possessing its own special methods or unique . priori insights.

Chapters 5 and 6 also concern methodological issues, first in the guise of whether or how a naturalistic approach can deal with questions regarding normativity (Chapter 5) and questions regarding just how philosophy as a practice fits into a naturalistic view of matters (Chapter 6). The accounts of normativity Kornblith considers in detail are those of Goldman and Stich. Quine he dismisses for failing to take seriously enough the question: “What, ultimately is the source of epistemic normativity?” (139) I would have thought that a good naturalist eschews just this sort of question. In any case, his critique of Goldman proceeds much more straightforwardly than does his critique of Stich. For Goldman, unlike Stich or Kornblith, seems content in the end to offer a decidedly unnaturalistic conceptual analysis of notions such as justification (165). Kornblith, quite rightly, questions how this analysis squares with Goldman’s acknowledgment that some other notion of justification might be preferable to the one we now possess (143-45).

His critique of Stich proves much more elusive and labored. One wonders whether this reflects the fact that less separates Stich and Kornblith than Kornblith insists. Kornblith imagines that what separates his account from both Quine’s and Stich’s is that he gives reasons they lack for the importance assigned to truth. Yet, as I object below, Kornblith helps himself to a notion of truth for which he provides no argument and which rests uneasily with his naturalism. Thus, his philosophical distance from Quine and Stich may well be less than he imagines. However, it remains to Kornblith’s credit that he does clarify just why questions of normativity pose no special difficulty for a naturalist.

Chapter 6 concerns how Kornblith distinguishes philosophy from the special sciences used to answer philosophical questions. I take this as Kornblith’s way of approaching Quine’s (in)famous remark regarding the “mutual containment” of philosophy and empirical psychology. Kornblith appears to deny mutual containment. For he asserts, “Philosophy may properly be viewed as empirically informed theory construction without, at the same time, turning it into a series of chapters within the special sciences” (177). But does philosophy per se constitutes a form of knowledge? Kornblith encourages the thought that it does in remarks such as the following: “I do not see it [epistemology] as nothing more than a branch of cognitive ethology” (172). On one reading, this implies that philosophy does constitutes a type of special science in its own right. Yet philosophy in a naturalized perspective cannot be segregated from whatever processes one uses to study knowledge production. “Knowledge,” Kornblith insists, “is a feature of the world” (159). I remain unclear as to just how Kornblith would specify philosophy as a non-redundant form of empirical inquiry.

In chapters 3 and 4, Kornblith critiques what he takes to be the main competitors to his notion of knowledge as natural kind. Chapter 4 builds on familiar grounds, rehearsing a variety of externalist arguments against those who would put some internalist requirement on what to count as knowledge. Central to the notion of knowledge as Kornblith defends it is the view that non-language-users can and do have knowledge. Kornblith assembles some of the usual suspects—Descartes, Sosa, BonJour—for examination and summary dispatch.

Troubles typical of Kornblith’s case manifest themselves in the remaining chapters. Chapter 3 focuses on those, such as Brandom and Davidson, who would account for knowledge in terms of social practices, paradigmatically linguistic ones (163-4). On their view, knowledge, in its various forms, presupposes linguistic representation, in its various forms. But Kornblith maintains a form of reliabilism which denies that linguistic representation constitutes a necessary condition for knowing. Yet central to his account is his unexplicated and undefended notion of truth. For he defines reliability by reference to truth (full stop). This permits a conceptual disengagement of Kornblith’s account of reliability from social practices. Reliability, anchored by Truth, becomes the standard by which to evaluate competing social practices. “Knowledge does not require engagement with the epistemic practice of any community. What is good and bad in a given social practice is best measured by the standard of reliability, a standard that may be met with or without engagement in social epistemic practices” (102). Of course, determining what identifies this standard is something Kornblith leaves as an exercise for the reader.

The temptation to read the analytic/synthetic distinction back into Kornblith’s work constantly asserts itself. Knowledge links to reliability, and reliability links to truth. Truth, it seems, links to accurate representation. “What make this category [the category of knowledge] an important one, on my view, is not that people in our society have the concept; rather, it is that this category accurately describes a feature of the world” (165). The conception of knowledge endorsed by Kornblith “requires reliably produced true belief” (58, 62). Yet truth is not a property that appears to the senses. So while Kornblith makes it a defining property of the kind, nothing in either what he does or could tell us indicates what empirical property it is.

But why then his recurrent homage to Quine? The account of knowledge as accurate representation seems more Tractarian than Quinean. I thought problems began with the discovery that no sentence-by-sentence account of “accurate description” works. Put another way, to speak unproblematically of “accurate representation” for single sentences by-passes Quine’s reasons for naturalizing epistemology. If one takes seriously the problematic which Quine bequeaths to epistemology, one cannot simply help oneself to an unexplicated notion of truth qua “accurate representation.” (As Jim Maffie pointed out to me, Kornblith owes an account of truth that covers non-linguistic representations.) We literally, from a Quinean perspective, cannot understand what this means without falling back into ways of speaking about the world-word relation which Quine rejects. Kornblith imagines himself entitled to have it both ways. Just why I simply do not comprehend.

Chapter 2 stands as the philosophical core of this book, its raison d’être. For here Kornblith mounts his primary account and defense of his claim that knowledge “constitutes a legitimate scientific category. In a word, it is a natural kind” (29). The claim is novel, and on the face of it puzzling. Naturalism in its original American incarnation promised to link philosophy to science in the perennial philosophic quest to clear away what obscures rational inquiry. Declaring that naturalism links to natural kinds, however, undoes this by burdening the relatively unproblematic notion of empirical inquiry with that of natural kinds.

In a Quinean spirit, I note that the occurrence of ’natural’ in ’naturalism’ and its occurrence in ’natural kinds’ constitutes an orthographic accident. They stand conceptually unrelated, for the latter notion reads necessities into nature which no empirical method could possibly discover or divine.

For a naturalist, the term ’natural’ cannot itself be explanatory or invoked as a fundamental concept. The term goes proxy for a denial of . priori knowledge (and methods, e.g. conceptual analysis, that rely on appeals to . priori insights) and for situating the pursuit of philosophical questions within the methods of and evidence for empirical science. Nothing is natural simpliciter. “Nature” is itself not an analytic primitive. Naturalists cannot fall back on appeals to “nature” or “the natural” without, in short, ceasing to be naturalists. In this regard, an appeal to, e.g., a natural kind can only be understood as a shorthand reference to further properties, ones empirically specifiable within some science or other.

To the best of my knowledge, no one prior to Kornblith has attempted to effectively reify the notion of knowledge by claiming for it kind-like status. Why think of natural knowledge as a type or natural kind? Kornblith’s answer, as best I understand it, reifies knowledge in order to account for the causal role it plays in scientific theories. “The category of knowledge is, on my view, an important category because it has a certain theoretical unity to it, that is, it plays a causal and explanatory role within our current best theories” (165; see also 159, 164). Which “best theories” does Kornblith reference? Ones in cognitive ethology. Here we find what empirical case he makes for the critical claim that knowledge has a “theoretical unity,” a unity which underwrites and legitimates, Kornblith believes, the causal/explanatory role ethologists assign to it.

The specific argument here starts from the fact—and it is a fact—that animal ethologists use intentional descriptions to characterize various types of animal behavior. Of special interest are highly coordinated behaviors, such as ravens “tricking” other birds in order to steal eggs or “deceptive” behavior by piping plovers to lure predators away from nests (31-2). Indeed, Kornblith insists, adversion to intentional descriptions of animal behavior proves to be necessary; without it, scientists could not characterize what the behaviors had in common, and so could not use it to explain and predict (34).

Reliabilism works in just here. For, Kornblith maintains, “it is beyond dispute that the animal will need to represent features of its environment if it is to deal with it effectively at all” (38). That is, if intentional and belief states can be justly attributed to any animal, that animal (indeed, the species (56-7)) can be said to have representational states. Moreover, this representational capacity, while it may supervene on physical states, cannot be identified with the physical states. “No doubt beliefs are entirely physically composed; but this does not require that they form a homogenous physical kind” (40). All that remains once Kornblith has argued that animals have representational states is to argue that these states are produced by reliable mechanisms. “It is the focus on this adoption of these cognitive capacities to the environment that forces us to explain the possibility of successful behavior, and it is the explanation of successful behavior that requires the notion of knowledge rather than mere belief. Knowledge explains the possibility of successful behavior in an environment, which in turn explains fitness” (57). Reliable representations constitute knowledge; animal behaviors can be best explained as a response to these reliable representations; therefore, knowledge has a necessary role in both explaining and predicting behavior.

What establishes the kindness of knowledge qua reliable representation is its special role in a theory that “succeeds in prediction and explanation” (40). The essential homogeneity of reliable systems—their kind-constituting feature—is thus specified functionally, not physically. “Knowledge is a robust category in the ethology literature; it is more than belief, and more than true belief. It requires reliably produced true belief. Understood in this way, knowledge is properly viewed as a natural kind” (68). Kornblith interprets knowledge in terms of fitness, as reliable adaptation between an organism and its environment. “Knowledge,” he states, “is an ecological kind: it has to do with the fit between an organism and its environment” (65). The relationship need not be static; what matter is just that changes in the ecological niche register in a reliable way on and for the organism. “I take natural kinds to be homeostatically clustered properties, properties that are mutually supporting and reinforcing in the face of external change” (61). The properties, whatever they are, support inductive inferences. Whatever makes representations reliable suffices, on this account, to make the associated categories projectible.

This brings me to my central complaint. Kornblith’s entire case for taking ethologists at their word with regard to imputing knowledge to non-human animals rests on the asserted explanatory and predictive value of doing so. But, in the ethologists’ case, absolutely nothing Kornblith provides establishes either claim as legitimate. Start with the claim for predictive efficacy. Paradigmatic here is his discussion of the ravens who ’distract’ a hawk in order to steal its egg. Nothing in Kornblith’s account, or in any of the accounts he provides, shows the theoretical necessity of imputing knowledge in order to predict what the ravens do. Indeed, nothing Kornblith says shows that the specific incident could have been predicted in this way, apart perhaps from noting “ravens do things like this.” Put ravens around eggs and they will do what they can to take them. What, in short, does adding the assertion that ravens know something or believe something do to enhance the predictability of what ravens do in these situations? Put another way, what properties in the world would a naturalist have to uncover in order to establish that, indeed, knowledge states are at work? What would the discovery of “knowledge” be the discovery of?

Ditto for claims that imputing beliefs and desires explain. Kornblith asserts, regarding such animal behavior, that while “the behavior is straightforwardly explained by appealing to beliefs and desires, no one has ever offered an explanation of such complex behaviors in terms that obviate the need for representational states” (42). But the necessity for using this vocabulary works in only because Kornblith defines reliability by appeal to truth. An animal’s ability to succeed in its ecological domain is then attributed to knowledge, i.e., reliably produced true beliefs. Only by definitionally smuggling truth in does he legitimate talk of knowledge in his desired sense:

When we turn to an explanation of the cognitive capacities of the species, however, the theoretical enterprise we are now engaged in requires more than mere belief… . It is the focus on this adaptation of these cognitive capacities to the environment that forces us to explain the possibility of successful behavior, and it is the explanation of successful behavior that requires the notion of knowledge rather than mere belief. Knowledge explains the possibility of successful behavior in an environment, which in turn explains fitness… . The resulting true beliefs are not merely accidentally true; they are produced by a cognitive capacity that is attuned to its environment. In a word, the beliefs are reliably produced. The concept of knowledge which is of interest here thus requires reliably produced true belief. (57-8)

Successful adaptation requires attribution of certain cognitive capacities; explanation of how the cognitive capacities adapt the species to the environment requires attribution of knowledge. Knowledge means, by definition, representations that are reliably produced. Reliability means, by definition, the process engendering the beliefs produces more truths than falsehoods. Definitional sleight of hand, not science, makes truth and knowledge an inextricable part of Kornblith’s ethological picture.

Understanding the definitional factors proves critical as well to accounting for what supposedly makes knowledge a natural kind. Knowledge qua kind consists of the set of reliable belief-producing mechanism and their outputs, whatever these might be. “What is being claimed here is that natural selection is selecting for knowledge-acquiring capacities, that is, processes of belief acquisition that tend to produce truths … .” (59). If such processes and their outputs were not “homeostatically clustered,” Kornblith assumes they would not provide a basis for stable inferences. In other words, the “various information processing capacities and information gathering abilities that animals possess are attuned to the animal’s environment by natural selection, and it is thus that the category of beliefs that manifest such attunements—cases of knowledge—are rightly seen as a natural category, a natural kind.” (62-3) The kind has biological reality because the environment selects for it.

Which natural, i.e., empirical feature allows anyone to identify a process as a member of this kind? For reliability itself does not exist as any single or necessary empirical property of any system. Reliability characterizes only functioning (or, functioning-in-a-specified-environment). To think otherwise would be to commit a version of a Rylean category mistake. Kornblith’s category mistake mistakes the parts of a system—individually or jointly—for the property of interest.

Put another way, the sole identifying characteristic for Kornblith’s knowledge qua natural kind is that “the properties that are ultimately responsible for this homeostatic unity are also responsible for a wide range of the kind’s characteristic properties” (62). Now, when dealing with atomic structure of water (Kornblith’s example), reference of “the properties” which account for homeostatic unity seems clear enough. We have in hand a theory specifying the relevant features and how they interrelate. But nothing answers to the definite description Kornblith must take “the properties” to entail generally in the case of reliable systems of natural knowledge. Reliability entails no determinate set of natural features and their articulated interrelationship. But if it is not identified necessarily with any of the parts, or with any known relationship of these parts, how can reliable systems constitute a natural kind? The reliability in the case of diverse natural systems can be known only ex post facto given the very definition of the term. Any list of properties such as Kornblith imagines can thus be only contingent and functional, and so not the stuff of which necessities and natural kinds are made.

Reliable systems may all be natural systems, but that does not entail that any physically discernable feature of any system marks it as reliable. Absent a theory of reliability on the order of, e.g., theories of atomic structure, no reason exists, contra Kornblith, for believing that reliability marks out a natural kind.