Knowledge and Lotteries

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Hawthorne, John, Knowledge and Lotteries, Oxford, 2004, 205pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199269556.

Reviewed by Matthew McGrath, University of Missouri, Columbia


In this monograph, John Hawthorne examines the skeptical threat that lottery propositions pose for our knowledge of mundane matters of fact. Suppose I have a lottery ticket in a large fair lottery and the winner has not yet been announced. It seems obvious that I can’t know my ticket will lose. But if I can’t know this, it seems I can’t know I won’t be able to afford an overseas vacation this year. Jonathan Vogel (1990) stressed the “semi-skeptical” implications of denying lottery knowledge. In effect, we enter a lottery when we leave our parked cars (winners have their cars stolen), and even by being just by being alive (winners die of a heart attack next year, or tomorrow). We are thus threatened with the conclusions: . don’t know that my car is where I parked it, I don’t know I will attend the next APA, I don’t know I will go to work tomorrow. If appeals to quantum mechanics carry sufficient epistemic weight – as Hawthorne believes they do – perhaps even our knowledge that the chair we’re looking at will still exist in a moment’s time is jeopardized: for all we know, it might presently become a chair-façade. There is nothing “semi” about this sort of skepticism.

This monograph adds significantly to the growing literature on the skeptical threat posed by lotteries. But it is also an important contribution to epistemology in general, and especially the intersection between epistemology and the philosophy of language. The book is also a good read. It is filled with engaging arguments, for and against various positions, many of which spill over into the footnotes, where they undergo promising developments.

A solution to the lottery puzzle, in Hawthorne’s view, should ideally accommodate the following intuitive constraints (111-2):

1. The Moorean Constraint: Very many ordinary knowledge attributions are true.

2. The Assertion Constraint: One is incorrect to assert what one doesn’t know.

3. The Practical Reasoning Constraint: One ought only to use that which one knows in a premise in one’s deliberations. (30)

4. Single Premise Closure (SPC): Necessarily, if S knows that p, and S competently deduces that q while retaining knowledge that p, then S knows that q. (34)

5. Multipremise Closure (MPC): If S knows p1, …, pn, and S competently deduces q from p1, …, pn while retaining knowledge of each of the pi’s, then S knows that q. (33)

6. The Epistemic Possibility Constraint: It is possible that p for S at t (There is a chance that p for S at t) iff p is consistent with what S knows at t. (26)

These constraints are not imposed as make-or-break requirements, but as desiderata. Other constraints appear in the discussion (an “objective chance” principle linking objective chance with epistemic probability, Van Fraassen’s “Reflection” principle, a Kripke-style disquotation schema for ’know’ linking the making of knowledge attributions claims about the speaker’s belief), but the six above do the most work.

Hawthorne ably defends each of these constraints in the first chapter of the book. This reader, however, would have liked to have seen more discussion of the epistemic possibility constraint in particular. Hawthorne uses this constraint to drawn the conclusion that if S knows that p, then the probability for S that p is 1. But can’t we sensibly talk of knowing on the basis of better or worse evidence for p? You may know Monday that you will teach your class Tuesday, but Tuesday, when you are teaching the class, you will have better evidence than you do on Monday. Hawthorne himself (138n53) approvingly cites Dretske’s (2000, 48) remark that constructions such as “know better than anyone” to describe “not better knowledge, but more direct, more compelling kinds of evidence.”

In chapters 2-4, Hawthorne examines solutions based on four sorts of theory about ’knows’: contextualism, skeptical invariantism, simple moderate invariantism, and sensitive moderate invariantism. Although he does not stump for any of these theories, his sympathies clearly lie with the last. After giving a brief account of his conclusions about the second and third, I will focus on his treatment of the first and fourth.

Skeptical invariantism (SI) holds that ’knows’ does not vary in content across contexts and that most (if not all) of our ordinary positive knowledge attributions are false. So, under SI, we don’t know lottery propositions, nor do we know what we ordinarily think we know.

SI fares well by the epistemic possibility constraint and the closure principles, though it obviously sacrifices the Moorean constraint. It also fares poorly by the assertion and practical reasoning constraints. If SI is true, then we know very little. We know few of the propositions we assert or rely on in practical reasoning. Given the assertion and practical reasoning constraints, it would follow, rather startlingly, that nearly all of our assertions and practical inferences are improper.

Simple Moderate Invariantism (SMI) holds that ’knows’ does not vary in content across contexts, and that most of our ordinary knowledge attributions are true. The versions of SMI that Hawthorne focuses on accept single premise closure. Because SMI allows knowledge of mundane matters of fact, then, it also allows knowledge of entailed lottery propositions. We do, after all, often know our ticket won’t win.

SMI fares well by the Moorean constraint, but poorly by the assertion and practical reasoning constraints. If I know my ticket will lose, why can’t I assert it will lose? And if I know my ticket will lose, why can’t I, when offered one cent for my ticket, use this knowledge in a piece of practical reasoning whose conclusion is that I ought to sell? Such a piece of reasoning, though, is clearly improper. SMI, moreover, like many other non-skeptical theories, cannot comfortably accommodate MPC. If I know my ticket will lose, it seems I can know yours will lose will, too (if indeed it will), and similarly for all other losing tickets. Given MPC, I would seem positioned to conclude, knowledgeably, that nearly all of the tickets will lose. This seems clearly wrong.

Hawthorne’s treatment of contextualism is in many ways groundbreaking, and deserves extended discussion. Here I will mention only the highlights. The contextualist holds that ’know’ varies in content across contexts and that most of our ordinary knowledge attributions are true. The most attractive forms of contextualism accept single premise closure, and therefore hold that, when the standards are low, a sentence such as “I know my ticket will lose” will be true in my context. The contextualist solution to the lottery puzzle appeals to a context-shift involved when the possibility of winning becomes salient. When I am thinking about the paper I am to deliver at the APA, I am in a context in which “I know I will give a paper at the APA” is true, and so also one in which “I know I will not have a fatal heart attack before next April” is true. But when the possibility in which I have a fatal heart attack becomes salient for me – say as a result of your pressing me on the matter – the context shifts so as to drive up the standards for knowledge (more precisely, the standards for the applicability of ’knows’), with the consequence that in the new context, neither of these knowledge-attributing sentences is true. When we fall into skepticism, we tend to think that our earlier knowledge claims were false. This is a mistake. Our earlier claims were true, and so are our later claims.

Hawthorne finds much to like in a contextualist approach to the lottery puzzle. It allows us to explain the attraction of lottery-skepticism while cleaving to our belief that many of our ordinary knowledge attributions are true. He mentions and develops a number of now-standard problems for contextualism, including the untoward consequences of postulating a semantic blindness to extreme variations in contextually determined standards for knowledge (cf. Schiffer 1996, Feldman 1999). What’s exciting, though, is the argument that contextualism fails to respect the assertion and practical reasoning constraints. After all, didn’t Keith DeRose (2002) use the assertion constraint to argue for contextualism?

Here is Hawthorne’s argument (with proper names in place of indexicals). (85-91) Suppose that Bob is in an everyday low standards context. He asserts ’p’ on the basis of good evidence. It seems Bob’s assertion, in his context, may well be proper. Suppose it is. Sue is in a high-standards context. Thinking about Bob, Sue can truly say “Bob didn’t know p”. Whether the sentence “Bob properly asserted p” is true or false depends only on how things are with Bob, and so not on features of Sue’s context. So, it seems that “Bob properly asserted something he didn’t know” is true in Sue’s context. This violates the assertion constraint. Similarly, insofar as “Bob properly used p in practical reasoning” is context-invariant, it seems that “Bob properly used p in practical reasoning even though he didn’t know it” will be true in Sue’s context. This violates the practical reasoning constraint.

The basic move in both arguments is to formulate an intuitive first-order principle linking ’know’ to some context-invariant predicate that can vary in its application across cases that are identical with respect to “purely epistemic” factors.

Contextualists might reply (as Keith DeRose (manuscript) has) that when Sue is thinking about whether Bob should assert that p or should use p in practical reasoning, she ought (in some sense) to use the standards operative in Bob’s context. If she uses Bob’s standards, then she will not be able to truly assert violations of the assertion and practical reasoning constraints. However, this doesn’t answer Hawthorne adequately. First, Hawthorne’s point is about the truth of a sentence in a speaker’s context, not about whether the speaker could truly utter the sentence. The assertion and practical reasoning constraints fail to be invariantly true if there are contexts in which violations of them are false, even if there are no contexts in which they can be truly uttered. Second, if the contextualist is to accommodate the invariant truth of the assertion and practical reasoning constraints themselves, then speakers will need, in a single utterance, to use different epistemic standards for different subjects. Thus, “One should assert only what one knows” will express a proposition for all S, t, S should assert p, at t, only if S stands in k(S, t) to p, where k(S, t) is the epistemic standard contextually determined by S’s context at time t. But, as Jason Stanley (2004) has stressed, there seems to be no such “bound variable” reading available for sentences like the original generalization. (Compare the example Hawthorne discusses in a footnote (98n116): “everyone went to a local bar.” As he explains, in this case, one can “hear” the bound variable reading.) In any event, one of the crucial pieces of evidence for contextualism cited by Cohen (1999) and DeRose (1992) is that that people in high stakes contexts, like Sue, intuitively speak the truth in saying, “I don’t know that p and nobody with my evidence knows that p.” This requires that ’know’ not take the bound variable reading.

Let me mention a minor complaint here. Hawthorne is rather casual about whether the assertion and practical reasoning constraints state necessary or sufficient conditions, or both. This creates problems in the argument against contextualism. There is, to my mind, little doubt about the assertibility, for high-stakes Sue, of “Bob doesn’t know that p, but he is rational to act as if p.” As Hawthorne notes, there are many cases in which one is rational to act on mere assumptions (39n77). The anti-contextualist argument is stronger if it is based instead on the claim that being entitled to use p in practical reasoning is a necessary condition of knowledge that p. (Fantl and McGrath (2002) appeal to a similar necessary condition in an argument against contextualism.) Contextualism cannot accommodate the proposed necessary condition any more than it can the sufficient condition.

Hawthorne’s final chapter develops Sensitive Moderate Invariantism (SNMI). The basic idea behind SNMI is to utilize the same “non-epistemic” factors utilitized by the contextualist, not as speaker factors affecting the content of ’knows’, but as subject factors affecting only the truth-value of knowledge attributions. Hawthorne discusses two such factors: salience and practical environment. Whereas the contextualist cites salience of counterpossibilities as potentially driving up the standards for ’knows’, under SNMI, the claim is instead that counterpossibilities that are salience to a subject may destroy that subject’s knowledge. Similarly, whereas the contextualist cites practical environment as potentially driving up the standards for ’knows’, under SNMI the claim is that a subject’s practical environment can make a difference to whether she knows.

Hawthorne understands salience of a counterpossibility that p as an intellectual seeming with the content for all I know, p. (169) And he considers three models of its knowledge-destroying power: the belief removal model (salience can strip you of belief or the surety needed for knowledge), the evidential model (salience is a defeater of your justification), and the authority model (thinking that you don’t know is incompatible with knowing). He expresses a guarded preference for the first model. (173) Unfortunately, this model makes us right merely by accident when we conclude we don’t know our ticket will lose. We ordinarily think we don’t know because our evidence isn’t good enough. As it turns out, though, that it’s only our lack of confidence holding us back. It is hard to see, then, how we can ordinarily know that we don’t know that our ticket will lose. We seem to have only a lucky true belief that we lack such knowledge. And if that is right, then by the assertion and epistemic possibility constraints, we cannot properly assert “My ticket might win.” This is very hard to accept.

Applied to the lottery puzzle, SNMI apparently must lean hard on salience. (Practical environment helps only when what it is rational to do is affected by the assumption that your ticket will lose, e.g., as when you’re offered a cent for your ticket.) When we focus on lottery propositions, it is hard to resist what Hawthorne calls “parity reasoning,” in which one conceives of a set of possibilities in such a way that, for each member of the set, one has roughly the same evidence that it will obtain. (16) Parity reasoning makes the possibility of winning salient, destroying our knowledge that our ticket will lose. Yet, when we aren’t focused on lottery propositions, or when we are but manage to avoid parity reasoning, we know our tickets will lose. So, it seems that only a fairly attenuated skepticism follows.

Supposing someone is able to avoid parity reasoning, could he, by deduction, come to know, concerning a lottery of, say, 5001 tickets, where ticket2 is the winner, that ticket1, ticket 3, etc. and ticket 5001 will all lose? This seems ridiculous, even for 1000 out of the 5001 tickets. But doesn’t MPC guarantee the possibility of his knowing this conjunction? Hawthorne suggests the possibility of saving MPC by appealing to the concept of determinacy. (184) The discussion is overly brief. The idea seems to be that MPC is spared insofar as we only indeterminately know that #1 will lose, that #3 will lose, etc. Presumably, in this setting, MPC will demand only that if one has determinate knowledge of the conjuncts, then one has at least indeterminate knowledge of their conjunction. MPC is therefore consistent with our having indeterminate knowledge of the conjuncts and determinate ignorance of their conjunction. If this is how MPC is spared, though, it comes at the price of a kind of semi-skepticism. We thought we determinately knew we would be at the APA. It turns out that we don’t.

So, SNMI, like the other non-skeptical theories, seems to fare poorly by MPC. However, it respects the assertion and practical reasoning constraints, and does well by the Moorean constraint.

Hawthorne owns up to peculiarities of SNMI: knowledge comes and goes more than we would expect, depending on stakes, anxiety and the like. A different philosopher, laying down constraints on a solution to the lottery puzzle, would be well within her rights to include in her list of constraints an “epistemicism constraint”: whether one knows that p depends only on the strength of one’s epistemic position with respect to p, where the latter is a matter of truth-related factors such as evidence for/against p, reliability on p, and counterfactual relations to p. It is the sacrifice of this constraint, I think, that is the main cost of sensitive moderate invariantism.

One can try to cast doubt on the epistemicism constraint by asking hard questions about what it is for a factor to be “truth-related.” But these doubts will seem like cold comfort when turns to examples. In Cohen’s (1999) airport case, Mary and John have the same evidence as Smith does that the plane stops in Chicago – Smith’s itinerary – but Mary and John have much more at stake than Smith. Doesn’t it just seem, intuitively, that Smith doesn’t know if Mary and John don’t? And doesn’t this seem to be so because Smith and Mary and John have the same quality of evidence for thinking that the plane stops in Chicago.


Cohen, Stewart (1999). “Contextualism, Skepticism, and the Structure of Reasons.” Philosophical Perspectives 13, 57-89.

DeRose, Keith (manuscript) “On the Ordinary Language Basis for Contextualism and the New Invariantism.”

_____ (2002). “Assertion, Knowledge, and Context.” Philosophical Review 111, 2, pp. 167-203.

_____ (1992). “Contextualism and Knowledge Attributions.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 52, pp. 913-29.

Fantl, Jeremy and McGrath, Matthew (2002). “Evidence, Pragmatics, and Justification.” Philosophical Review 111: 1, pp. 67-94.

Feldman, Richard (1999). “Contextualism and Skepticism.” Philosophical Perspectives, 13, pp. 91-114.

Schiffer, Stephen (1996). “Contextualist Solutions to Skepticism.” Proceedings in the Aristotelian Society, 96, pp. 317-33.

Stanley, Jason. 2004. “On the Linguistic Basis for Contextualism.” Philosophical Studies 119: 1, 119-46.

Vogel, Jonathan (1990). “Are there Counterexamples to the Closure Principle?” in M. Roth and G. Ross, Doubting: Contemporary Perspectives on Skepticism (Dordrecht, Kluwer).