Knowledge and Practical Interests

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Jason Stanley, Knowledge and Practical Interests, Oxford University Press, 2005, 191pp, £35 (hbk), ISBN 0199288038.

Reviewed by Duncan Pritchard, University of Stirling


Every now and again in philosophy there is an explosion of interest in an idea. Often, that idea is not even particularly new, but has simply been given a clear, crisp statement at a critical point in the debate; at a point when those engaged in the discussion have grown particularly tired of the usual circles of debate. For such an explosion to take place, it is essential that the idea challenges, or at least appears to challenge, the official orthodoxy.

Just such an explosion happened in the early 1990s as regards attributer contextualism, affecting initially just epistemology, but soon many other areas of philosophy as well, so that anyone seriously engaged in philosophical debate felt obliged to have a view on the matter. As is now familiar, the essential idea behind attributer contextualism is that 'knows' is a context-sensitive term such that relative to the different epistemic standards in play in distinct conversational contexts, the same knowledge-ascribing sentence could express different propositions. Thus two ascribers, in different conversational contexts which embody different epistemic standards, could assert the same sentence which ascribes knowledge to a subject while only one of the assertions expresses a truth. Clearly such a view is as much a thesis in the philosophy of language as it is in epistemology, and so draws in other areas of philosophy straight away. Once one also notices that what holds for 'knows' here could well hold for other philosophically interesting terms as well, then the import of this proposal for philosophy in general becomes manifest.

The attributer contextualist bandwagon has in recent years started to wane in popularity. The difficulties with the view have been slowly mounting, forcing some increasingly ad hoc responses, and, worse, the application of this programme to the big questions in philosophy, especially scepticism, has started to look suspect. In short, the attributer contextualist research programme has started to look like it is degenerating. This is not the place to write the history of attributer contextualism, though I do think it would be a particularly interesting case-study in philosophical trends: how they start, how they develop, how they end -- and what all this can teach us. What is interesting for our purposes is that while the attributer contextualist research programme has started to run out of steam, it has led to other views in epistemology being developed which preserve some of the spirit of attributer contextualism. One such view is the subject contextualism that has recently been defended, first by John Hawthorne in his 2004 book Knowledge and Lotteries (OUP), and now by Jason Stanley in his book, Knowledge and Practical Interests.

The kind of view that Stanley and Hawthorne defend eschews attributer sensitivity, and so is in this sense a non-contextualist, or invariantist, position (Stanley describes his position as "interest-relative invariantism", while Hawthorne describes his version of the thesis as "subject-sensitive invariantism"). Nevertheless, the view is still in the general spirit of contextualism, since there is a wide-ranging context-sensitivity here, albeit a sensitivity which is to the subject's practical interests rather than one that is concerned with the epistemic standards in play in the attributer's conversational context. For example, Stanley's big idea is that, as he puts it in the preface (v), "what makes someone's true belief a case of knowledge is partly determined by facts from the domain of practical rationality", an immediate consequence of which is that what is at stake for a subject in the context in which she finds herself can have a direct impact on whether her true belief will count as knowledge. This is why I refer to the view as a form of subject contextualism.

Stanley's book, like Hawthorne's before it, is a model of clarity and showcases one of philosophy's brightest young things at his best. Both books are essential reading. Stanley's book (my concern here), is particularly good on setting-out the problems for attributer contextualism, and contains strong discussions of relativism and vagueness. In short, it's a great, wide-ranging, must-read book.

That's not to say that it doesn't have problematic aspects. For example, Stanley notes that it follows from his view that "the difference between true belief and knowledge is not purely epistemic" (v), and this means that "the distinction between practical and theoretical rationality is less clear than one might wish" (2). Given this challenging ramification of Stanley's thesis, it is odd that he never really engages with the contemporary literature on practical rationality. (Relatedly, another puzzling lacuna in the book is that there isn't any real attempt here to engage with the old forms of subject contextualism either -- such as the influential version of subject contextualism that Michael Williams defended in his book Unnatural Doubts (Blackwell, 1991). Indeed, one would also like to have heard more about how his view compares with Hawthorne's). Moreover, what is said about practical rationality -- such as his claim that one should only act on what one knows -- is prima facie dubious. What are we to make of the activities of the rational scientist, for example, who may not even believe that her favoured theory is true (just that it's the best one available)? Is such a person acting irrationality in taking such a view on trust? I'm sure Stanley has an answer to this sort of question; it's just that he doesn't share it with us.

In a similar way, there are junctures in the book where one feels that the obvious objections are not being fully engaged with, partly, one suspects, because Stanley has implicitly taken their resolution to be entirely straightforward. To take a suitably mundane example, we had electricians re-wiring our flat recently. Making a mistake about whether the electricity is turned off could have had disastrous effects, and so one might naturally think that the practical stakes of being right in this regard are very high, perhaps about as high as they ever get in normal contexts. On the subject contextualist view that Stanley urges, then, should these electricians regard themselves as not knowing whether the electricity is off? That would be an odd conclusion, I think. (Imagine, for example, one of the electricians who is about to touch a wire asking another electrician -- someone who has just gone to check that the electricity is off, say, and now returns to carry on work -- if he knows that the electricity is off, and is told 'no', even though the informant is clearly intent on touching the wires himself. Wouldn't this strike one as rather odd?) Perhaps this conclusion can be avoided, however. Perhaps, for instance, one could argue that the kind of expertise possessed by these electricians, along with the sorts of checks that they make as a matter of course, suffices to enable them to retain knowledge even in this high stakes context. Still, if Stanley does have a line like this to offer -- or some other line for that matter -- then it would have been nice to have heard it.

I don't want to focus on these sorts of complaints, however, since I think they are largely peripheral to the main claims of the book. Moreover, as I say, I'm sure Stanley has responses to problems of this sort up his sleeve anyway. Instead, I want to focus on a problem facing subject contextualism that I think goes right to the heart of the view. Furthermore, I want to suggest that the problem owes its source to the earlier attributer contextualist view that it has grown out of. In short, the problem relates to the odd examples that contextualists, both attributer and subject, focus upon.

What interests me are self-ascriptions of knowledge, and what they tell us. As J. L. Austin taught us, when we claim to know -- in the explicit sense of saying, "I know p" -- we are doing more than merely indicating that we have knowledge; we are also giving our word that what we say can be trusted. In this sense, self-ascribing knowledge incurs a kind of commitment to the proposition known, and this means that this commitment is not easily lost (at least not if we take our commitments seriously, as we should). More specifically for our purposes, this commitment is not lost simply as a result of merely (broadly speaking) pragmatic considerations. That is, if our judgement about whether or not we know changes, then this commitment will certainly be lost, but if, say, we merely judge that only practical factors have altered -- such as the fact that it is now more important, practically speaking, that what we say is true -- then this ought to do nothing to undermine our commitment.

This point in part explains why we in fact do not normally self-ascribe knowledge by explicitly saying "I know", but rather by simply asserting the proposition putatively known. If one takes one's commitments seriously, then one does not incur them lightly. There is also another explanation for our reluctance to explicitly self-ascribe knowledge, and this is that, usually at least, it is only appropriate to make an explicit claim to know in the light of some (perhaps unstated) challenge to a previous claim (Austin also taught us this point, by the way, as did Wittgenstein). If you ask me what the time is, it would be bizarre to reply by saying that I know the time to be such-and-such. If I told you what the time is though, and you challenged this -- perhaps by raising the possibility that my watch is slow -- then it might be conversationally appropriate to reply by saying that I know what I asserted. In doing so, I would be representing myself as being someone who could be trusted on this score, and also indicating that the challenge in question could be set to one side (that I have good grounds for thinking that my watch is not slow, say).

Considerations like this highlight just what is so odd about the sorts of cases that the early contextualists used to focus upon, cases in which agents go from explicitly claiming knowledge, even though no challenge has been entered, to explicitly conceding that they don't know, even though all that has changed in the interim, even by their own lights, are merely pragmatic factors (e.g., what is at stake). Take a 'bank' case, for example, where someone claims (often for no apparent reason it seems) that she knows that the bank is open, but then goes on to reverse this claim and say that she doesn't know that it is open merely in response to some pragmatic factor being raised (e.g., that it is important that a large cheque is cashed today). People just don't talk like this, and for good reason, since it fails to recognise the constraints in operation on the legitimate entering of knowledge claims and also offends against the 'commitment' aspect of a knowledge claim. If you claim to know something, then you'd better be willing to stick with that claim, at least until something comes along to weaken your epistemic standing on this score.

Note that this is not to deny that purely pragmatic factors can alter whether one is willing to continue explicitly claiming knowledge of a certain proposition, since this can surely happen, and does. The crucial point, however, is that conscientious agents don't reverse their claims to know -- i.e., move from explicitly claiming that they do know, to explicitly conceding that they don't -- purely in response to pragmatic factors (which would be contrary to the 'commitment' aspect of a knowledge claim). What they might do, for example, is no longer assert what they previously asserted, but there can be good Gricean explanations for this. If, for example, one knows that an explicit claim to know in this context would generate an implicature which is false (that one has made special checks, for example), then one would be disinclined to make the assertion (even though one was willing to make such an assertion in a previous context). Significantly, though, in merely not making the assertion one wouldn't thereby be conceding that one does not know the target proposition, and so not making the assertion in this context need not imply that one is no longer committed to this proposition which one previously asserted that one knew.

Attributer contextualists have a response to this sort of objection. First off, they don't concede the point being made here that agents do not reverse their explicit claims to know in response to purely pragmatic factors (relatedly, they don't seem to recognise any constraints as being in operation on when one can legitimately enter a knowledge claim either). I don't know what to do to convince someone who doesn't accept this point except to suggest that they go and listen to how people speak (normal people, that is, not other philosophers). Given that they don't accept the intuition, they can insist that nothing they say conflicts with the 'commitment' aspect of claiming knowledge. After all, on this view, the proposition asserted in the first assertion ("I know that the bank is open") is not the negation of the proposition asserted in the second assertion ("I don't know the bank is open"), because of the context-sensitivity of 'knows'. Thus, that saying one knows implies a commitment in the way that I suggested is entirely consistent with attributer contextualism.

Subject contextualists will also reject the intuitions I've stated here, though I notice that Stanley, unlike early attributer contextualists, never gives an example in which an agent explicitly self-ascribes knowledge and then explicitly claims not to know in response to purely pragmatic factors, possibly because he recognises that he's on weaker ground in this regard. Nevertheless, on his view, as with all subject contextualist views, there ought to be cases like the bank case as I described it above. Notice, though, that the move we just saw being made by attributer contextualists is unavailable to subject contextualists like Stanley because of their endorsement of invariantism. But without this move, it is unclear what such a subject contextualist view is to do with these cases. Subject contextualism is thus, it seems, completely at odds with this thesis about knowledge claims, a thesis which I would argue is unassailable.

This is a fundamental problem for subject contextualism, and it reveals, I think, a failure on the part of subject contextualists like Stanley to get to grips with what is really the data that we are trying to accommodate with our theories. It holds this failing in common with attributer contextualist views -- indeed, it inherits the failing. With the data properly described, it isn't at all clear that there is much in the way of motivation for contextualism, at least from the first-person case.

Still, as I have indicated, I doubt a critical line of this sort would persuade many involved in this debate, since the discussion is now so well advanced that these initial points of departure for the general contextualist research programme have become part of the wallpaper of the project. In any case, the interest in Stanley's book survives the problems facing the view he outlines anyway. This is a book that is rich with insight and argument and which has a broad philosophical reach. These features of the book by themselves ensure that it is essential reading.