Knowledge and Presuppositions

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Michael Blome-Tillmann, Knowledge and Presuppositions, Oxford University Press, 2014, 197pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199686087.

Reviewed by Geoff Pynn, Northern Illinois University


Contextualists hold that the epistemic requirements for the truth of a knowledge claim vary with the context in which the claim is made. One of the major tasks for contextualists is to theorize the interaction between context and the contents of claims to 'know'. David Lewis, building on the pioneering work of Gail Stine and the relevant alternatives theorists of the 1970s, developed an influential account in his 1996 paper "Elusive Knowledge". Lewis said that someone 'knows' P in a given context just in case her evidence eliminates all of the ~P-worlds not properly ignored in that context.[1] He provided a characteristically ingenious set of rules to mark out the shifting boundary of ignorable worlds. The key gear in Lewis's contextualist machinery was his Rule of Attention, which says that no possibility attended to in a context is properly ignored in that context. As our attention varies, the set of ignorable worlds shifts, contracts, and expands.

Michael Blome-Tillmann's book defends Lewisian contextualism, with one crucial alteration. Instead of letting the alternatives vary with our attention, Blome-Tillmann has them vary with our pragmatic presuppositions. The Rule of Attention is replaced with the Rule of Presupposition, which says that no possibilities compatible with the pragmatic presuppositions in a context are properly ignored in that context.[2] Blome-Tillmann develops and defends his idea in penetrating detail, applying it to a wide variety of topics in contemporary analytic epistemology.

The book is outstanding. It is a must-read for anyone with a serious interest in the semantics of knowledge claims, especially those not already familiar with Blome-Tillmann's 2009 paper of the same name. Readers who already know his earlier work will find a lot of interesting new material here, too. Blome-Tillmann is a virtuosic and patient problem-solver: he presents a detailed solution to the skeptical problem in chapter two, responds to a slew of objections in chapters three and four, tackles "Further Puzzles" in chapter five, and finally heads into a rabbit warren of problems concerning Mooreanism, the closure principle, and "transmission failure". His solutions are careful, creative, and in many cases quite satisfying (though I will quibble with some). His overall achievement is to show that Lewisian contextualism, modified along the proposed lines, is not only capable of withstanding many familiar attacks, but is a fertile source of ideas and strategies for epistemological theorizing. I recommend it enthusiastically.

At the heart of the book is what Blome-Tillmann calls the Simple View:

S satisfies 'knows P' in context C only if S's evidence eliminates all the ~P-worlds compatible with what is presupposed in C. (34)

Within the Lewisian framework, the Simple View follows from the Rule of Presupposition. Blome-Tillmann calls any view that incorporates the Simple View a form of "presuppositional epistemic contextualism," or PEC. The particular version of PEC that he wishes to defend is basically Lewis's, with the Rule of Presupposition replacing the Rule of Attention (with a few other improvements, too). But for contextualists who do not go in for Lewis's picture, the presuppositional idea should still be appealing, and Blome-Tillmann says that the Simple View alone does "most of the philosophical and explanatory work" in the book (34).

It is a familiar complaint against the Rule of Attention that some possibilities seem epistemically irrelevant even when we're attending to them. A nice example from Michael Williams illustrates the point: your teenage son, whom you saw sneaking out of the house in the middle of the night, can't truly deny that you 'know' he snuck out simply by observing that you could have been having a vivid dream. Blome-Tillman says that the threshold a possibility must cross to attain epistemic relevance is not mere attention, but being taken seriously, or, as he also puts it, being among the "live options" (20). He suggests that we "explicate the notion at issue" in terms of presupposition. Since what we presuppose is to a certain extent under our control, the Rule of Presupposition implies that the contextual shifts in the contents of knowledge claims are, too, which Blome-Tillmann thinks is an advantage over Lewis's Rule of Attention. Later I will suggest that presupposition may not be an adequate tool for explicating the notion of seriousness, precisely because it is too much under our control. Nevertheless, by putting the presuppositional view to productive work throughout the book, Blome-Tillmann provides the best kind of defense of a substantive philosophical thesis. I am convinced that Lewisians should accept it, and non-Lewisian contextualists should agree that there is an important link between presupposition and the contents of knowledge claims.[3]

The conception of pragmatic presupposition Blome-Tillmann has in mind is Robert Stalnaker's. A speaker presupposes P in a context just in case she is disposed to behave, in her use of language, as if she believed P to be common ground in that context. The common ground, in turn, consists of those propositions we jointly accept for the purposes of conversation.[4] The proposal thus links contextualism to an important paradigm in philosophical semantics and pragmatics, replacing hand-wavy talk of "epistemic standards" with the more rigorous centerpiece of the Stalnakerian approach to conversational dynamics.

Chapter two argues that PEC explains the complexity of our skeptical intuitions better than Lewis could. Lewis's Rule of Attention implies that we cease to 'know' that we have hands as soon as we attend to the uneliminated possibility that we are handless brains-in-vats. PEC, by contrast, allows that a variety of responses to the skeptic may be appropriate. Blome-Tillmann distinguishes three ways a subject might react to a skeptic's intervention. "Unsteady" subjects immediately drop any presuppositions incompatible with the skeptic's uneliminated possibilities, "persistent" subjects hold fast to their anti-skeptical presuppositions, and "indecisive" subjects are "simply unable to make up [their] mind[s]" (40). PEC predicts that, upon encountering the skeptic's argument, the unsteady will cease to 'know', the persistent will continue to 'know', and it will be unclear whether the indecisive 'know'. So unsteady subjects who judge that they 'don't know' and persistent subjects who judge that they 'know' will have "adequate intuitions", while the muddy intuitions of unsteady subjects will be "as adequate as they can be" (40-41).[5]

Blome-Tillmann recognizes that his view predicts that speakers will sometimes be "mistaken about the truth-values of 'knowledge'-ascriptions when skeptical arguments are the topic of their conversations" and offers an "error theory" to explain such mistakes (43-49). Suppose I decide to play along with my conspiratorial friend who is convinced that the moon landing was an elaborate hoax, dropping my presupposition that the moon landing really happened, and hedging my assertions accordingly. Nonetheless I think his claim that I don't 'know' that Armstrong walked on the moon is false. According to the Simple View, I am wrong: the hoax possibility is compatible with our presuppositions and uneliminated by our evidence. Blome-Tillmann says that my mistake arises from blurring the distinction between our "public context of utterance" and my "private context of thought" (43). That the moon landing was not a hoax is presupposed in the latter but not the former, so I 'know' with respect to the latter but not the former. And "competent speakers are sometimes blind to the fact that 'knows', as uttered in their public context of conversation, is sensitive to what is presupposed in that public context of conversation and not to what is presupposed in their private context of thought" (47).

I can't quite get a grip on the slippery idea of a private presupposition. Blome-Tillmann suggests that we make sense of the notion by "conceiv[ing] of the solitary thinker as being in a covert conversation with herself" (63). Presumably, then, to privately presuppose that P is to be disposed to think (i.e., assert to yourself) only what you would think if you believed that you accepted P, believed that you believed this, etc. I have a hard time grasping what this disposition amounts to, but insofar as I can, I don't see how anyone who accepts P can fail to have it. Could I accept that I have hands without being disposed to think those thoughts I would think if I believed that I accepted that I had hands (and so on)? Perhaps, but the matter is far from clear. If there is no gap between acceptance and private presupposition, then the Simple View cannot explain how you could accurately judge, with respect to your private context of thought, that you do not 'know' something that you nonetheless accept.

The next two chapters answer a dozen or so objections. Chapter three is focused on objections to PEC itself. Chapter four concerns objections to contextualism per se, and while it relies on PEC to some extent, most of what Blome-Tillmann says there could be endorsed by any contextualist. It should be carefully studied by anyone still moved by the objections to contextualism raised by John Hawthorne, Jason Stanley, and others a decade ago. It is a marvelous compendium of collectively decisive responses, and ought to put to rest the myth that there is any serious tension between contextualism and our linguistic behavior.

In chapter six, Blome-Tillmann shows how, within the framework of Lewisian PEC, to reconcile the principle that knowledge can be expanded via competent deduction with the idea, developed most fully by Crispin Wright, that certain deductively valid anti-skeptical arguments are instances of "transmission failure"; i.e., that they are such that deductive inferences from their premises is not a way to gain justification to believe their conclusions. As far as I can tell, the reconciliation does not depend essentially upon the book's distinctive view about the role of presupposition, and could be endorsed by a traditional Lewisian; in fact, I think it could be endorsed by a non-contextualist relevant alternatives theorist as well. The key move is to distinguish between justification that involves eliminating relevant alternatives and justification that involves having evidence that makes a proposition sufficiently likely. I found the proposal plausible and promising, and recommend the chapter to anyone with an interest in these issues.

In chapter five Blome-Tillmann discusses Gettier cases, the lottery problem, and inductive knowledge. I will focus on the lottery problem, since it raises some general concerns about the explanatory adequacy of PEC. I think analogous concerns arise for Blome-Tillmann's discussion of inductive knowledge as well as his approach to the skeptical problem, though here I can only provide a preliminary sketch of the points.

Lotteries make trouble for Lewis. His Rule of Resemblance says that no world that "saliently resembles" the actual world is properly ignored, but a world where I win a major lottery later this year closely resembles the actual world (at least, the assumption that it does is needed to generate the trouble).[6] So Lewis seems to require that my evidence eliminate the lottery-winning world if I am to 'know' that I won't afford a house this year. This is worrisome, since my evidence does not eliminate this possibility. The worry goes beyond literal lotteries. As Jonathan Vogel, Hawthorne, and others have pointed out, for most propositions we ordinarily take ourselves to 'know', it is easy to imagine inconsistent but uneliminated possibilities that, while highly unlikely, closely resemble the actual world. The Rule of Resemblance thus seems to have far-reaching skeptical consequences.

In response, Blome-Tillmann rephrases the Rule, replacing "salient resemblance" with "epistemic resemblance". Epistemic resemblance is defined in a "non-reductionist" way: world w epistemically resembles actuality with respect to a proposition P just in case nobody in the actual world can 'know' P in any context unless her evidence eliminates w (146). But you can 'know' that you won't afford a house without having evidence that eliminates the lottery-winning world, hence that world doesn't get dragged in by the refashioned Rule. This solution won't satisfy anyone looking for a non-circular analysis of 'knowledge', but Blome-Tillmann isn't looking for one. He cites with approval Timothy Williamson's suggestion that non-reductive accounts of epistemic notions provide us with "valuable structural information" (147). Readers in the grip of a reductionist ideology are likely to be frustrated, but I find this attitude entirely congenial, and have no complaint about the new Rule.

Nonetheless, most speakers are inclined to judge that they don't 'know' lottery propositions. This is why lottery propositions are interesting to epistemologists. Why should this be, if lottery-winning worlds do not epistemically resemble actuality? Blome-Tillmann says that PEC provides a "powerful explanation of our oscillating intuitions about our 'knowledge' of lottery propositions" (148). The explanation is that in a typical conversation about lotteries, the uneliminated possibility that we will win is compatible with what is presupposed, and so (by the Rule of Presupposition) we don't 'know' that we won't win. But ordinarily, when we're not talking about lotteries, we do presuppose that we won't win, and as a consequence do 'know' this.

My first concern with this suggestion is that it is not obvious to me whether we do, in fact, presuppose lottery propositions in our ordinary conversations. Consider this one, borrowed from Hawthorne:

(H) I am not one of those apparently healthy people who will suffer a fatal heart attack next week.

It is surely true that I often assert things that are true only if H is true. But to assert something that entails P is not yet to presuppose P, otherwise we could never fail to presuppose any logical truth. Am I typically disposed to act, in my use of language, as if I believed that H were common ground? I am not at all sure, but I am somewhat inclined to think that the answer is no. Some evidence: the more clearly a sentence entails or semantically presupposes H, the more reluctant I would be to assert it without hedging. And I would be quite reluctant to assert H itself, much less that I 'know' it.[7] It seems wrong to insist that, despite this reluctance, I am nonetheless disposed to behave, in my use of language, as if I believed H were jointly accepted.

But suppose that I do ordinarily presuppose that H. Imagine we are talking about our summer plans, claiming 'knowledge' of the future with abandon, when our conversation turns to H. I feel the familiar reluctance, and say that I don't really 'know' whether it is true, dropping the relevant presuppositions. What has happened? The explanation underwritten by the Simple View is that I no longer 'know' H because my presuppositions have changed: the dropped presuppositions made the ~H-possibility epistemically relevant, and since that possibility is uneliminated, I ceased to 'know'. But it seems vastly more natural to say that I dropped the relevant presuppositions because I came to see that I do not 'know' H. Certainly if you asked why I won't presuppose anything that entails H, I'll answer, "Because I don't know H." But if I've dropped the presuppositions because I don't 'know', how can the dropping of the presuppositions be what explains why I don't 'know'?

Generally, it seems to me that an option's becoming recognizably 'live' happens before, or at least independently from, the corresponding shift in my linguistic dispositions. This leads back to the question of whether presupposition is the best tool to model what it is for a possibility to be taken seriously. Suppose that E is a ~P-possibility uneliminated by our evidence, and that in a quotidian context we 'know' P. Now shift the background in such a way that we come to recognize that E is a serious possibility indeed. Provided our evidence has not improved, we should cease to 'know' P; this is, after all, what happens in a standard contextualist contrast case. But as far as the Rule of Presupposition is concerned, we can continue to 'know' P, as long as we steel ourselves against the loss of our quotidian presuppositions.

For all the Simple View says, it should be possible to respond to serious error possibilities by engaging in "wishful talking," acknowledging that while E is a very serious ~P-possibility uneliminated by our evidence, we nonetheless 'know' that P. We could shore up our 'knowledge' of P in the face of serious doubt simply by stubbornly refusing to drop the presupposition of P: "Yes, things will be very bad for us if the bank has changed its hours, and we can't eliminate that possibility -- nonetheless, I insist that we know that the bank will be open on Saturday." The fact that this conversational move would be bizarre suggests that presupposition is too much under our direct control for the Simple View to explain why serious possibilities cannot be ignored. To be recognized as serious is one thing, to be allowed by our presuppositions, another. This is not an argument against the Simple View, but rather against the idea that the Simple View explains how variations in what is serious produce shifts in the contents of claims to 'know'. Perhaps we simply need a Rule of Seriousness, according to which no possibility sufficiently serious may be ignored. This would be compatible with most everything Blome-Tillmann says in his seriously excellent book.

[1] Lewis uses the terms "evidence" and "eliminates" in specific, quasi-technical senses. Your evidence consists of the totality of your perceptual experiences and memory states, and a world w is eliminated by your evidence when your evidence is other than it would be in w. Blome-Tillmann follows Lewis in these uses, discussing in chapter five how the quasi-technical sense of "evidence" relates to the "more familiar notion of evidence that we use in science, legal discourse, and in everyday life" (154).

[2] Since no other notion of presupposition is relevant here, I will henceforth drop the "pragmatic".

[3] As a non-Lewisian contextualist, I would not endorse the Simple View as stated, because I do not accept the evidentialist picture of knowing that it presupposes. Nonetheless, I do think that the contents of knowledge claims can be modeled in terms of epistemic necessity over a restricted domain of worlds, and having largely been convinced by Blome-Tillmann's work, that in the best models the domain restriction will reflect the presuppositions of conversational participants (among other things). So I happily endorse the Simple View in spirit, if not quite its letter.

[4] Officially, the common ground consists of those propositions we all accept (for the purposes of conversation), believe that we all accept, believe that we all believe that we all accept, "etc." (23). I will use "jointly accept" as shorthand.

[5] Things become more complicated when we consider a conversation between, say, an unsteady subject and a persistent subject. In such mixed conversations the context is apt to be "defective"; i.e., the participants will have different presuppositions. See pages 41-43 for Blome-Tillmann's treatment of this complication.

[6] In fact the problem depends upon the conjunction of the Rule of Resemblance and the Rule of Actuality, but this complication isn't important for either stating the problem or discussing Blome-Tillmann's solution.

[7] Stalnaker posits a pragmatic prohibition against asserting a proposition that is already part of the common ground (see, e.g., pp. 88-89 of his 'Assertion', in Context and Content, Oxford University Press, 1999). But even if there is such a rule, we are willing to violate it all the time. My partner and I are puzzling through the evidence. "Okay," I say, summarizing everything we know so far, "we know that Smith was in Los Angeles at the time of the murder." There is nothing objectionable here, even if what I said was already jointly accepted between us.