Knowledge and Skepticism

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Joseph Keim Campbell, Michael O'Rourke, and Harry S. Silverstein (eds.), Knowledge and Skepticism, MIT Press, 2010, 367pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780262513968.

Reviewed by Allan Hazlett, University of Edinburgh


This volume collects a selection of papers presented at the 2004 Inland Northwest Philosophy Conference on a diverse set of topics in epistemology, which the editors have divided into two parts: ten essays on "knowledge" and four on "skepticism." This diversity is the biggest obstacle the volume has to overcome. It's one the editors were aware of (the essays are described as "eclectic yet coherent"), and it's unclear whether the volume is successful on this score. Four essays concern, in one way or another, epistemological contextualism (those by David Hemp, Duncan Pritchard, Kent Bach, and Robert Stainton); this is as close as the volume gets to having thematic unity. Two essays concern the history of philosophy (George Pappas and Peter Fosl); three are critical of epistemological skepticism (Leora Weitzman, Joseph Cruz, and Catherine Elgin); others concern theories of epistemic justification (Peter Graham), the nature of color experience (Joseph Tolliver), knowledge of pain (Fred Dretske), and probabilistic inference (John Pollock).

Is this lack of unity a problem? That depends on what one is looking for; the book couldn't feasibly be used as a text for a course. Taken individually, there are some outstanding contributions. Salerno offers an intriguing criticism of a well-known objection to the necessity of sensitivity for knowledge. Pritchard sketches a non-contextualist account of knowledge attributions; Stainton suggests a contextualist alternative to standard contextualisms. Pappas defends an interpretation of Locke on which perceptual knowledge is non-inferential. Dretske and Pollock propose fascinating and under-discussed epistemological problems: to explain how we know that we're in pain, when we're in pain (Dretske) and to explain how we estimate probabilities in real-world situations (Pollock, who proposes an elaborate solution to his problem). Epistemologists interested in these topics will want to read these essays.

Students of epistemology may not find much of benefit in the volume, however. For one thing, many of the essays are on "advanced" topics and would not make sense to someone unfamiliar with the relevant literature. Graham's critique of standard taxonomies of theories of justification would be incomprehensible to someone not versed in those taxonomies. Pritchard, Bach, and Stainton's discussions of moves to be made in the debate over contextualism would not be suitable as introductions to that debate.

For another (more important) thing, the editors' introduction is unorthodox, littered with undefined jargon, and mistaken or misleading in a few places. For example, the editors define "evidentialism" as the view that only other beliefs can justify a belief (pp. 3-4). But the most prominent self-described "evidentialists" in contemporary epistemology are Earl Conee and Richard Feldman, who defend a different view under that heading. The editors formulate Moore's anti-skeptical argument (p. 12) in such a way that it is deductively invalid. "Traditional theories of knowledge" are said to "have assumed that 'know' is univocal" (p. 8); but historically epistemologists have had very little to say about the semantics of knowledge attributions. ("Invariantism" is a linguistic thesis proposed in response to contemporary contextualism, another linguistic thesis.) The etymology of "epistemology" is incorrectly appealed to in defense of defining epistemology as the theory of knowledge (epistêmê can just as easily mean "understanding"). Crucial jargon ("Ancient Trilemma," "skepticism") is employed but left unexplained and undefined. So students should steer clear of the introduction.

Some epistemologists might find many of the topics addressed in Knowledge and Skepticism to be, for lack of a better word, "old-fashioned." You'll find no discussion here of the contemporary "hot topics" in epistemology: knowledge and action, disagreement, understanding, the value of knowledge. Some may find this return to tradition appealing, others may not. But some of the ideas defended in Knowledge and Skepticism are quite familiar: that skeptical arguments rely on epistemic principles (something both Moore and Chisholm convincingly argued for), or that endorsing skepticism would have negative practical consequences (something Hume and Reid agreed about).

This "old-fashioned" feel is perhaps partly the result of the volume's late appearance relative to the time the essays were presented in 2004. In the theory of knowledge attributions, for example, Pritchard's essay has been available electronically since 2005 and has already influenced the debate, while Bach's essay has effectively had its impact already, given that it overlaps significantly with his 2005 paper "The Emperor's New 'Knows'."[1] For an area of research that proceeds as briskly as the debate about knowledge attributions, the late appearance of these essays is disappointing.

Knowledge and Skepticism does suggest a picture of the "state of the art" (at least circa 2004) when it comes to the (admittedly "old-fashioned") issues of the nature of knowledge and the problem of skepticism. I'll venture three observations.

First, epistemological contextualism has come of age. What began as a radical rebellion against tradition has become its own ancien régime. In part this is because contextualism's rise in epistemology increased interest in knowledge attributions per se, as distinct from concern with knowledge attributions vis-à-vis the problem of skepticism. In the debate over attributions, contextualism (of a certain kind) is seen as the status quo, and is the foil of choice for dissenters (subject-sensitive invariantism, contrastivism, Gricean "maneuvers," and others), who make themselves known by articulating their particular form of dissent. The essays from Pritchard and Bach are dispatches from this loyal opposition. Stainton suggests a contextualism that departs significantly from the standard view, in sympathy with Jason Stanley's well-known criticisms of it. Hemp's essay applies the contextualist's idea to "shows," as in "if you know p on the basis of evidence e, e must show that p." The marshalling of a diverse collection of critical opponents, and the maneuvering and reformulating in response to those opponents, are manifestations of contextualism's maturity.

Second, while the question of how knowledge is possible -- i.e., the problem of skepticism -- has pride of place in epistemology, there is enlightening work to be done on a distinct question: the question of how we know what we know. The distinction (which I borrow from Quassim Cassam) is one of presupposition: it's the distinction between asking how something is so much as possible, by way of questioning whether it is in fact possible, and asking how something happens, how it comes to be actual, how it works or operates, while presupposing that it is not only possible but actual. Quine famously urged epistemologists to focus on the question of how we know, as opposed to the question of how our knowledge is possible. Dretske's and Pollock's essays represent excellent work in that post-skeptical research program. It is obvious, Dretske observes, that I can know that I'm in pain, when I'm in pain. But how do I know? Pollock's problem is similar, though it has even more bite as our actual practice of estimating probabilities cannot be explained given some familiar epistemological machinery (knowledge of probabilities plus the probability calculus). Given that we obviously do make justified estimates of probabilities, how do we do it? These kinds of questions about how we know, which can be approached both conceptually and empirically, are not unfamiliar to epistemologists, but we must remind ourselves that they deserve pride of place alongside the perhaps more familiar skeptical questions. (This is a corollary of Elgin's thesis, in her essay for the volume, that skepticism can be "set aside" for the purposes of other epistemological projects.)

Third, we epistemologists (or perhaps we philosophers, or perhaps we human beings) have a tendency to denigrate our past efforts. This may sometimes be out of shame that we wasted our time on some obviously "uninteresting" project (as though our present projects were timelessly "interesting") or perhaps simply to rhetorically shore up our current efforts, to make them look good by comparison with our unattractive past. These narratives of progress can be found at a few places in Knowledge and Skepticism. Graham, for example, justifies his novel taxonomy of theories of epistemic justification on the grounds that it will "carve a good deal of the debate about justification at its joints," (p. 45) by contrast with the standard taxonomy which is said to be "too narrow" and to define debates less "important" (p. 45) than those defined by the new taxonomy. But one wonders what this all could mean. What could it mean to say that the debate about internalism and externalism was failing to "carve the debate at its joints"? What could make one debate more "important" than another (apart from, say, practical relevance, which none of these debates have)? My point here is only that such denigration of past work seems unnecessary; Graham's novel taxonomy needs no such support to be successful. If one can draw some distinctions and say something true using one's preferred terminology, that's already an impressive philosophical achievement.

To sum up, then, the essays collected in Knowledge and Skepticism comprise a mixed bag, both in terms of topics and in terms of quality. Some are quite good and advance debates in their respective fields, and the volume deserves praise for bringing us those essays.

[1] In G. Preyer and G. Peter (eds.), Contextualism in Philosophy: Knowledge, Meaning, and Truth (Oxford University Press, 2005), pp. 51-90. Fosl's essay for Knowledge and Skepticism also overlaps with a previous paper, "Cracks in the Cement of the Universe: Hume, Science, and Skepticism," in R.C. Leitz and K.L. Cope (eds.), Imagining the Sciences: Expressions of New Knowledge in the "Long" Eighteenth-Century (AMS Press, 2004), pp. 257-90.