Knowledge and the Gettier Problem

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Stephen Hetherington, Knowledge and the Gettier Problem, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 241pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107149564.

Reviewed by Anthony Robert Booth, University of Sussex


The publication of Edmund Gettier’s famous paper in 1963 seemed to fire a start-gun in epistemology for a race to come up with a (reductive) analysis of knowledge. The finishing line would be an improved analysis over the ‘traditional’ Justified-True-Belief (JTB) account—improved in the sense that a subject’s knowing would be immune to ‘being Gettiered’. Correlatively, a parallel line of research opened up with the purpose of formulating what it is for a belief to ‘be Gettiered’, to explain why it is that a Gettiered, justified, true belief is never knowledge, and why it has been so hard to find a satisfactory analysis of it — what William Lycan (2006) called the ‘Gettier-problem problem’. Several such analyses of knowledge (with concomitant answers to the Gettier-problem problem) have been proposed to date, but none have enjoyed anything even vaguely approaching consensus.

Timothy Williamson somewhat revolutionised this research programme (see especially Williamson 2000) by proposing that we search in vain for a reductive analysis of knowledge, where knowledge is to be understood in terms of more basic concepts such as ‘belief’, ‘truth’, ‘justification’. Knowledge, proposed Williamson, is the more basic concept, in terms of which concepts like ‘belief’ and ‘justification’ ought to be understood. Williamson’s revolution has now recruited many supporters, and has inaugurated the popular ‘knowledge-first’ research programme. And this is not really all that surprising, given how little consensus there is in post-Gettier epistemology as to the correct analysis of knowledge. But what is surprising, given this paucity of consensus, is that there have not been more efforts than just Williamson’s to attempt revolution. So the established narrative has become: there was this ‘traditional’ JTB analysis, but then came Gettier, and no one could solve the puzzle, but then Williamson showed everyone that they were wrong.

But Stephen Hetherington has made efforts toward revolution in a prolonged series of journal articles in prominent journals where he argues that Gettier failed to debunk the JTB analysis (e.g. Hetherington 1996, 1998, 1999, 2010, 2011, 2012, 2016). One would think that this fact alone would lead to a re-telling of the established narrative, or to have lead to an embellishment of that narrative. But I think it’s fair to say that Hetherington’s work has not had the sort of impact on the epistemological community that one might have otherwise expected. The narrative survives unchanged.1 I think this partly explains the publication of Hetherington’s newest book — a book which I think deserves to have a big impact on epistemology. The book, in part, seeks to address the sorts of suspicion epistemologists had with Hetherington’s earlier attempts to articulate his defence of the tripartite account. As he puts it:

I wish to say more in support of [my] central argument . . . for a start, out of respect for those epistemological peers who might well suspect that there just must be a serious flaw in that argument. (p. 107).

This is not to say that the book is just a re-hashing of Hetherington’s articles. It does draw on his earlier material, of course, but it offers an independent and sustained line of argument. It is beautifully written, careful, detailed, precise, and contains several insightful and thought-provoking passages. It is primarily a book about the ‘Gettier-problem problem’, and is in fact dedicated to Lycan. It has a revolutionary tenor, in that its central argument is that no epistemologist has yet offered a satisfactory explanation as to why Gettiered belief is not knowledge, and no explanation will ever be forthcoming if epistemologists continue to pursue the idea that the clue to the explanation lies (at least in part) with fallibilism about epistemic justification.

Very roughly put, Hetherington’s reasoning is that in order to solve the Gettier-problem problem, one must understand why the special property of a belief’s ‘being Gettiered’ makes it impossible for a Gettiered belief to be knowledge. But a Gettiered belief qua Gettiered belief can never be false. And, as such, the property of being false in other possible worlds cannot be a property which will explain what it is for a belief to be Gettiered. In the aforementioned articles, this has previously led Hetherington to question the reliability of our intuitive judgements when we are presented with Gettier cases (sometimes calling the feeling that we are responding to these cases as fallibilists should: ‘the Gettier Illusion’2). But in the present book, Hetherington makes a distinction between what he calls the “Gettier datum” and the “Gettier moral” (see p. ix)the former being (roughly) the intuition that Gettiered beliefs are not cases of knowledge, and the latter the ensuing conclusion that there is something defective about the traditional tripartite analysis. And in the present book, unlike in earlier work, Hetherington is primarily concerned with resisting the Gettier moral, not the Gettier datum, arguing provocatively that the JTB analysis survives the Gettier datum.

The book proceeds as follows. In Chapter 1 we are introduced to what Hetherington calls “Gettierism”: “the thesis that Gettier was right in dismissing the justified-true-belief definition of knowledge” along with “a meta-epistemological element — the conviction that when we are pondering knowledge’s nature we are following an epistemologically fruitful lead only once we accept or at least presume Gettier’s being correct” (p. 10). All the major responses to Gettier are also introduced, but with a view to showing how each, in so far as it is a solution to the Gettier-problem problem, to some extent relies on the idea that the relevant explanation is to be found in fallibilism. Chapter 2 then presents the central challenge (as, very roughly, recounted above) to ‘Gettieristic’ solutions to the Gettier-problem problem. Chapter 3 puts Hetherington’s theory to the test by way of a very detailed case study on anti-luck responses to Gettier. Chapter 4 discusses, in again a lot of detail, possible objections to the argument presented in Chapter 2. Chapters 5 and 6 present two differing (but compatible) accounts as to why Gettierism emerged and has been so resilient — Chapter 5 in terms of covert commitments to infallibilism and Chapter 6 in terms of epistemologists’ “over-use” of the term ‘intuitive’ to describe general epistemological morals gleaned from Gettier cases. Finally, in Chapter 7, Hetherington presents his alternative to Gettierism. This is a fascinating theory, according to which all that is needed to account for, and understand, the Gettier datum, is a non-reductive, precisifying definition of knowledge.

Very roughly, according to Hetherington it is a necessary condition on a circumstance being a Gettier circumstance that the agent at the heart of the circumstance is not “aware” of the circumstance. Further, it is sufficient (but not necessary) for a belief to be knowledge that it is: “a belief that is true, well justified, and not Gettiered . . . where the belief is not Gettiered if the evidence includes an awareness of each circumstance that would make the belief Gettiered (and hence not knowledge) if that awareness was absent” (p. 217). Since the necessary condition Hetherington describes for being in a Gettier circumstance is meant to be an analysis of what constitutes evidence (justification) for an agent, Hetherington describes the condition as “wholly internalist”. As such, Hetherington takes himself to be in agreement with the Gettier datum: that Gettiered beliefs are never knowledge, but yet to reject the Gettier moral. According to his theory, knowledge is only ever a kind of (internalistically) justified true belief.

On finishing the book, I was left with two (what seemed to me) pressing questions. First, I wondered whether Hetherington’s non-reductive analysis is really helpful? Let me explain. Hetherington claims it is more helpful than the following:

Knowledge is one’s belief that is true, well justified, and not Gettiered — where not to be Gettiered is to not be in either the situations that Gettier described or any other sufficiently similar ones. (p. 217).

It is more helpful, claims Hetherington, because the above could yield only the following piece of “unhelpful” advice:

DoxAdv1 – If your belief is to be knowledge, your evidence for its truth must be good. So be sufficiently aware of your surroundings in order to have such good evidence. (p. 217, but my label).

On the other hand, Hetherington’s account is claimed to yield the following (putatively helpful, albeit generic) advice:

DoxAdv2 – If your belief is to be knowledge, your evidence for its truth must be good, and sometimes there are specific circumstances of which you must be aware if your evidence is to be good enough. So be aware of those, at the very least. (Gettier described some such circumstances for some situations). (p. 218, but my label).

I take it that Hetherington’s advice is “more” useful, since it tells us a bit more about what “good evidence” is meant to be — viz. that there are specific circumstances that we ought to be aware of. One the problem is that the account would be too demanding and succumb to scepticism if it required that we are aware of all circumstances. So which are the relevant circumstances that we need to be aware of? Without telling us this, the account is useless as a bit of advice. Hetherington anticipates the objection. “How do we even know that an independent criterion for that is even possible? The answer is that we do not. (We might know that p without knowing that we know that p). Accordingly, we should not pre-emptively rule out a less ambitious solution to the Gettier problem” (p. 218). Perhaps Hetherington is right. Perhaps it is wrong to think (as Williamson 2008 proposed) that epistemology is in the business of giving us advice as believers. But then what makes the account that yields DoxAdv1 uninformative, while the one that yields DoxAdv2 is not? Why not think that the account that yields DoxAdv1 should not be pre-emptively ruled out as a less ambitious solution to the Gettier problem?

Second, I wondered whether there was a way to resist the case made in Chapter 2 where Hetherington claims that “no belief in so far as it is the centrepiece of a Gettier case could ever be false there” (p. 42). In Chapter 4, Hetherington raises the obvious objection that his case relies on conflating the following two claims:

1. Necessarily, any belief formed within a Gettier case built around it is true. (De Dicto Reading).

2. Any belief formed within a Gettier case built around it is necessarily such that it is true. (De Re Reading). (p. 108).

And, so the objector would continue: Hetherington’s case relies on the De Re Reading above, but he is entitled only to the De Dicto Reading. Hetherington objects to the claim that he is not entitled to the De Re Reading, since to deny him it “overlooks how even Gettieristic epistemological practice treats the phrase and its equivalents as denoting a Gettiered belief in its capacity as an instantiation of a property” (p. 109). Put differently, the property that needs explaining is the property of ‘being Gettiered’ and so we will need to focus our attention on beliefs qua Gettiered beliefs if we are to adequately explain that property. This means that we are not entitled to go looking at possible worlds (close or otherwise) where the Gettiered belief is false — since we would no longer be investigating the property of being Gettiered. Sure, says Hetherington, the belief in the relevant Gettier case can be false when thought of simply as a belief tout court, but not when thought of as a Gettiered belief.

However, suppose we grant Hetherington this, and we follow this prescription (labelled ‘Platonic’ and cashed out via analogy):

One is not being philosophical in [the] relevantly Platonic way when one describes a particular stone only by registering detail after detail — the stone’s minutiae, right there and nowhere else. But one is being philosophical in [the] relevant Platonic way when gazing upon the particular stone as being a representative stone, such as by seeing it as symbolizing other relevantly similar stones. One would be looking for the universal — a property that could in theory be instantiated in different places at once — within the particular. One would see the particular details, yet one would, equally, be looking to see — or otherwise to experience and know — one or more universals being represented by those particular details. And this, I suggest, is what any analytic epistemologist, such as a would-be Gettierist, should be doing when confronted by a description of a Gettier case. (pp. 125-6).

So, suppose we fix our gaze only on possible worlds where the Gettiered belief (qua Gettiered belief) is true. What do we find that all these worlds have in common? The fact that there are nearby possible worlds where the Gettiered belief is false. The thing is that we find this by first ‘travelling’ to all possible worlds where there are Gettiered beliefs, and so we do not at this instance ‘travel’ to any worlds were the target beliefs are false. But then on having travelled to these worlds, we discover a further property they all have in common: that for all these worlds we’ve travelled to, there are close possible worlds where the target belief is false. We then resist the De Re Reading, but not because we are evaluating the belief qua ordinary belief (in what Hetherington calls ‘Gettier-Individualism’3) — in order to discover this universal about Gettiered-belief we have initially travelled only to worlds where the target belief is true. As such we can resist the De Re Reading, perhaps, while evaluating the target belief “in its capacity as an instantiation of a property”.

Of course, I am just asserting that there are always (or very often) close possible worlds to Gettiered-belief-worlds where the target belief is false.4 And maybe this claim should be up for further investigation. If so, then I think that Hetherington would have succeeded in somewhat re-aligning epistemological practise. His extremely stimulating book might not then usher in a ready-made revolution, but rather inaugurate something more akin to the stirring of tectonic plates at the start of a paradigm shift. The epistemological community has not experienced anything like that outside of Williamson’s excoriations. As such, I think that Hetherington’s book deserves to be taken very seriously indeed.


With many thanks to Brent Madison, Corine Besson, Sarah Sawyer, and Stephen Hetherington for comments on earlier drafts.


Antognazza, M.R. 2015: “The Benefit to Philosophy of the Study of its History,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy 23 (1), pp. 161-184.

Besson, C. 2009: “Logical Knowledge and Gettier Cases,” Philosophical Quarterly 59, pp. 1-19.

Booth, A.R. 2014: “The Gettier Illusion, the Tripartite Analysis, and the Divorce Thesis,” Erkenntnis 79, pp. 625-638.

Dutant, J. 2016: “The Legend of the Justified True Belief Analysis,” Philosophical Perspectives 29 (1), pp. 95-145.

Hetherington, S. 1996: “Gettieristic Scpeticism,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74, pp. 83-97.

Hetherington, S. 1998: “Actually Knowing,” Philosophical Quarterly 48, pp. 453-469.

Hetherington, S. 1999: “Knowing Failably,” Journal of Philosophy 96, pp. 565-587.

Hetherington, S. 2001: “A Fallibilist and Wholly Internalist Solution to the Gettier Problem,” Journal of Philosophical Research 26, pp. 307-324.

Hetherington, S. 2010: “Elusive epistemological justification,” Synthese 174, pp. 315-330.

Hetherington, S. 2011: “Abnormality and Gettier Situations: An Explanatory Proposal,” Ratio 24, pp. 176-191.

Hetherington, S. 2012: “The Gettier Illusion: Gettier-Partialism and Infallibilism,” Synthese 188, pp 217-230.

Hetherington, S. 2016: “Understanding Fallible Warrant and Fallible Knowledge: Three Proposals,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 97, pp. 270-292.

Lycan, W. 2006: “On the Gettier Problem Problem” in Stephen Hetherington (ed.) Epistemology Futures (Clarendon Press).

Williamson, T. 2000: Knowledge and its Limits (Oxford).

Williamson, T. 2008: “Why Knowledge Cannot Be Operationalized” in Quentin Smith (ed.) Epistemology: New Essays (Oxford).

1 Though see Antognazza 2015 and Dutant 2016 for persuasive accounts as to why the ‘traditional’ account is not in fact the JTB analysis.

2 See Booth 2014 for discussion.

3 “For any belief, it is necessarily true that if the belief is Gettiered, then it is not knowledge” p. 13; to be contrasted with “Property-Gettierism”: “Necessarily, the property of being Gettiered precludes the property of being knowledge” p. 14.

4 Leaving aside the issue of whether belief in necessary true propositions can be Gettiered; however see Besson 2009 for an account of how belief in necessary true propositions can be Gettiered.